Form, Matter, Substance

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Kathrin Koslicki, Form, Matter, Substance, Oxford University Press, 2018, 273pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198823803.

Reviewed by Daniel Z. Korman, University of California, Santa Barbara


Objects, according to hylomorphism, are compounds of form and matter. Kathrin Koslicki articulates and defends her own preferred brand of hylomorphism in this book, weighing in on how we should conceive of the matter and the form of such compounds, and on how they can qualify as fundamental "substances" despite being ontologically dependent on their components. The volume is a rewarding read, highly recommended for anyone working on the metaphysics of material objects or ontological dependence, and required reading for anyone doing metaphysics in the Aristotelian tradition. In what follows, I review Koslicki's principal claims and conclusions (§1), and then raise some concerns about her master argument for "individual forms" (§2) and her criticism of standard essentialist accounts of artifacts (§3).

1. Koslicki's Hylomorphism

After surveying the explanatory benefits of a hylomorphic account of objects (ch. 1), Koslicki turns to the question of how hylomorphists ought to conceive of the matter of a hylomorphic compound (ch. 2). She maintains that hylomorphists needn't take an object's matter to be a "prime matter" or "stuff", belonging to a different ontological category from the object whose matter it is. Instead, according to Koslicki, an object's matter is just its material parts, which are themselves hylomorphic compounds (though she is open to the empirical discovery of a bottom level of partless objects). This deflationary conception of matter is all that is needed, she argues, for matter to do its designated explanatory work, namely accounting for how objects come to be and cease to be.

In chapters 3-4, Koslicki addresses the forms of hylomorphic compounds, making two key contributions to the debates about form, all the while remaining neutral on the question of what exactly forms are (properties, relations, states, functions, powers, activities, or something else altogether). The first (ch. 3) is her defense of the "individual forms hypothesis", according to which no two entities can have one and the same form at a time, across time, or across worlds. The argument, in short, is that nothing other than individual forms -- neither universal forms, nor haecceities, nor facts about origins -- is able to explain crossworld identities. The second (ch. 4) is her defense of a "robust" construal of form, on which having a form is not simply a matter of having parts arranged a certain way. This opens the door for coinciding objects -- like a statue and lump of clay -- to differ in form, and she puts this formal difference to work in solving the "grounding problem" of explaining the modal differences between coinciding objects.

Chapters 5-7 address a puzzle about "substance" in the Aristotelian tradition. If you've spent any time with Aristotelians, you've probably noticed that they have a peculiar way of using the word 'substance', on which something must be fundamental in order to count as a substance. Although this makes it a nontrivial question whether ordinary objects are substances in the intended sense, Aristotelians almost invariably answer in the affirmative. Which is puzzling. After all, objects (for them) are hylomorphic compounds, and compounds are presumably ontologically dependent on their constituents, which would seem to make them nonfundamental. Koslicki concedes that hylomorphic compounds are not absolutely fundamental -- and thus are not substances simpliciter -- but insists that they are nevertheless relatively fundamental, and that they should be regarded as substances on account of their high degree of unity. (Chapter 7 provides a highly detailed account of what unity consists in.)

The final chapter (ch. 8) takes up the special case of artifacts. The bulk of the chapter is devoted to criticizing one family of essentialist views, according to which the essences of artifacts are determined by the intentions of their inventors or makers, though Koslicki also raises problems for anti-essentialist treatments of artifacts.

2. Individual Forms vs. Haecceities

Koslicki's master argument for individual forms is an argument from elimination (ch. 3.4.3). Something must explain facts about crossworld identities, the idea goes, and no alternative to individual forms is up to the explanatory task. The crossworld identity facts that she takes to stand in need of explanation come in two varieties: specific identity facts, for instance that entity e in world w is identical to Socrates, and general identity facts, for instance that no poached egg in any world is identical to Socrates.

Koslicki argues that qualitative character, matter, and origins -- even taken together -- cannot explain specific identity facts, on the basis of a thought experiment designed to show that distinct objects could nevertheless have had the same qualitative character, matter, and origins (92-95). (This is a clever and compelling argument, which resists quick summary and is well worth a look.) Universal (i.e., repeatable) forms are similarly unable to account for specific identity facts. After all, if distinct entities can have the same form, then having the same form does not suffice for the identity of crossworld individuals and thus cannot explain their identity (99).

Haecceitists, on the other hand, have no trouble accounting for specific identity facts. After all, if some otherworldly individual has the haecceitistic property being Socrates, that trivially suffices for the specific identity fact that that individual is Socrates. Koslicki raises two objections to haecceitistic accounts of crossworld identity. First, haecceities are said to have an ad hoc "postulated air about them", having been "invented by philosophers for no other reason than precisely to resolve the [crossworld identity] puzzles" (96). I don't think this is entirely fair to haecceitists. Perhaps some philosophers posit haecceities solely for this purpose. But others, myself included, believe in properties like being Socrates for the same reason we believe in properties like being grue -- namely, because we accept an abundant view of properties, and for reasons having nothing to do with an alleged need to explain specific identity facts.

Koslicki's second objection to haecceitism is that it is unable to provide a satisfying account of general identity facts. In order to explain why no poached egg in any world is identical to Socrates, haecceitists would have to claim that it is impossible for a poached egg to have Socrates's haecceity. But placing such constraints on instantiating Socrates's haecceity, Koslicki observes, cannot be motivated by "factors internal to the particular haecceities themselves" (97). Rather, this would have to be "an externally imposed necessary connection which is required to hold between the haecceity and its exemplifier" -- for instance a requirement that Socrates's haecceity be borne by a human. In short, haecceitists cannot provide an "internal" explanation of general identity facts.

I suspect, though, that individual forms aren't really any improvement on haecceities in either of these two respects. When contrasting haecceities with individual forms, Koslicki says that "hylomorphists may point to a whole arsenal of independent reasons . . . for positing forms as explanatory principles" (100). But the only arsenal she provides is an arsenal of reasons for positing forms, not for positing individual forms in particular. The only reason we are given for believing that there are such things as individual forms is that they are needed to explain crossworld identities, giving them the same "postulated air" as haecceities.

Do individual forms yield "internal" explanations of identity facts? It's hard to say, without further details (which Koslicki does not provide) about the internal structure of individual forms. Suppose she says that the form of Socrates is something like a simple, particularized property of humanity. In that case, we do evidently have an internal explanation of general identity facts: the required sortal is built right into the form, ensuring that no poached egg in any world has that form. But what we don't have is an internal explanation of specific identity facts. Nothing internal to this humanity form explains why no one other than Socrates can have it. Haecceitists, by contrast, easily provide an internal explanation: it's built right into the property of being Socrates that you can't have it without being Socrates. So it's a wash. Individual forms yield an internal explanation of the general facts but not the specific facts, while haecceities yield an internal explanation of the specific facts but not the general facts.

Suppose, on the other hand, Koslicki is thinking of Socrates's individual form as something like the complex property Socrates's humanity. In that case, both being human and being Socrates are built right into Socrates's form, paving the way for an internal explanation of both general and specific identity facts about Socrates. But now we seem to have built a haecceity into Socrates's form. This, in turn, would seriously undercut Koslicki's main goal in chapter 3, which was to show that individual forms are preferable to universal forms. For once she admits that there are haecceities, it is unclear what there is to be gained by artificially building them into the individual form, rather than appealing separately to universal forms to explain general identity facts (and the "whole arsenal" of other things forms are meant to explain) and to haecceities to explain specific identity facts.

3. Artifacts and Maker Intentions

The final chapter targets what I'll call maker essentialism: for any artifact a and artifactual kind K (or function F), a is essentially a K (or has F) only if a was made with the intention that it be a K (or have F). I'll mention Koslicki's two main objections to maker essentialism.

The first objection concerns "ready-mades" (230-4). Suppose that one happens upon a wine-rack-shaped piece of driftwood, and intends to use it (without any alteration) as a wine rack. Many maker essentialists maintain that, merely by eyeballing the driftwood and forming the indicated intentions, one thereby brings a new object -- a wine rack -- into existence, right where the driftwood is. This is already absurd, but Koslicki piles on. If indeed one can bring a wine rack into existence in this way, then by parity of reason, she argues, one should be able to bring a thermometer into existence simply by intending that there be a thermometer right where my pen is (made up of the pen's matter). Certainly, though, one would not thereby succeed in bringing a thermometer into existence.

I like this argument. Luckily for maker essentialists, the view of ready-mades that Koslicki is targeting here is not entailed by maker essentialism, and can be rejected by maker essentialists. Maker essentialists can and should place additional constraints on bringing physical artifacts into existence -- requiring, for instance, that their constitutive matter be substantially altered in some way -- thereby preventing wine racks and thermometers from being so easily brought into existence.

Koslicki's second main objection, by contrast, strikes at the heart of maker essentialism, pointing to cases in which maker intentions seem not to be authoritative in determining the essential kind and function of an artifact. She has us imagine a misunderstood Alexander Graham Bell, whose famous device was originally intended to serve as a hearing aid, and was subsequently mistaken for a long-distance communication device. Koslicki says:

Given [maker essentialism], the device Bell invented is in fact a hearing-aid (and essentially so); and the same applies to every subsequent device which is successfully produced with the intention of being of the same type as the device Bell invented. (227-8)

But, of course, it's absurd to suppose that modern-day telephones are essentially hearing-aid devices.

Here, I think, is how maker essentialists should respond. The device that Bell made is a telephone. But it isn't essentially a telephone. It is essentially a hearing aid. Just as a stapler can be a doorstop without essentially being a doorstop, something can be a telephone without essentially being a telephone.

How about the telephonesque devices produced by subsequent makers? To keep things simple, let's suppose that these makers are all familiar with Bell's device and were intending to make a device of that kind. But this was not their only intention. They also intended to make a telephone, whose function is long-distance communication. So which intention wins out in determining the essential kind and function of the device they made?

The obvious answer is: whichever intention was stronger. And it's almost certainly the intention to make a long-distance communication device that's stronger, as evidenced by the fact that, upon being informed that Bell's prototype was a hearing aid, they still would take themselves to have made something that's for long-distance communication. That said, it's possible that some subsequent makers had an overriding intention to make what Bell made, come what may and even if his device turns out not to be the type of thing they think it is. In that case, some of the subsequent telephonesque devices are essentially telephones and others -- the ones made by the fanatically deferential makers -- are essentially hearing aids.

Koslicki briefly addresses the idea that Bell and subsequent makers made different kinds of things (crediting the response to Simon Evnine). She criticizes it for an "ontological proliferation" of kinds, and recommends in its place "an account which allows that the intentions of later users can override the intentions of the original author as to how his or her invention is best put to use" (229 n.11). But I don't see how later users would be capable of affecting the essence of the physical object Bell made. Let's say that he finished making it at t, and let's ask: what sort of essence does that object have at t, before people started intending to use it for long-distance communication?

There seem to be three options, none of which looks especially promising. The first is that his device has no essence at all at t, which would make it a curious object indeed. The second is that it is essentially a hearing aid at t and only later comes to be essentially a telephone. But the idea that objects can switch essences is odd, to say the least, and anyway yields the same "ontological proliferation" that Koslicki is trying to avoid. The third is that it is essentially a telephone even back at t, as a result of how it will later be used. But this would seem to require some sort of backwards causation (or determination).

Perhaps, though, we should understand Koslicki as suggesting that there is some objectively best way of using the object, and that a thing's essential kind and function are determined by how the object is best put to use (cf. 236). In that case, one could say that Bell's device was essentially a telephone at t, not as a result of facts about how it is used after t but rather as a result of (timeless) facts about how it is best used. But that can't be right. For suppose that, unbeknownst to everyone, telephones emit radiation that helps restore the ozone layer, and that this is how they are best put to use. The envisaged account of essence determination would then be committed to saying (absurdly) that present-day telephones aren't essentially for long-distance communication. Rather, they are essentially for replenishing the ozone layer and are correctly used by holding them up to the sky, not to our ears. Moreover, it may turn out that your phone is completely malfunctional -- despite being able to place calls just fine -- because it has stopped emitting the ozone-restoring radiation.

Koslicki's book is engaging and thought-provoking. I highly recommend it to anyone working in metaphysics, and I hope that it receives the attention that it deserves.


Thanks to Chad Carmichael for helpful feedback.