Form without Matter: Empedocles and Aristotle on Color Perception

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Mark Eli Kalderon, Form without Matter: Empedocles and Aristotle on Color Perception, Oxford University Press, 2015, 216pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198717904.

Reviewed by Katerina Ierodiakonou, University of Athens/University of Geneva


Right at the beginning of his preface, Mark Eli Kalderon makes explicit the character of his book (p. vii): 'This is an essay in the philosophy of perception written in the medium of historiography.' He further explains that his reason for writing it was to use Aristotelian ideas in order to defend his anti-modern conception of colour and colour perception, according to which colours are not secondary qualities, as the dominant modern conception argues, but 'mind-independent qualities of material surfaces, transparent volumes, and radiant light sources', while colour perception consists in 'the presentation of particular instances of these qualities in the visual awareness afforded by the subject's perceptual experience.' So, in his attempt to seek alternative perspectives for thinking outside the modern paradigm, Kalderon claims that he was prepared to learn from his predecessors, and in particular from Aristotle. It is reasonable, then, that the issue which immediately arises, especially in the mind of a historian of ancient philosophy, concerns the extent to which he is willing to stretch the Aristotelian texts in order to tell his own story; or, in other words, the extent to which his reading of Aristotle is coloured by his own philosophical agenda. For, as Kalderon himself admits, the mere fact that his anti-modern understanding of colour and colour perception does not accord with the modern conception does not mean that it has to coincide with Aristotle's premodern theory.

Kalderon states that his book makes both historical and philosophical claims (p. ix). In the present review, however, I choose not to discuss his views about colour and colour perception, and in general about sensory presentation; for if I were to do full justice to them, I would have needed to take into consideration the author's many articles on this subject. Instead, I focus on his historical claims and ask the question whether they are reliable as interpretations of Aristotle's doctrines. First, though, let me outline the book's nine chapters in the hope that the concise character of my summary does not misrepresent his main points.

The first two chapters are devoted to the theories of perception that Greek philosophers before Aristotle put forward, and in particular to Empedocles' theory of vision. The reason is that Kalderon interprets Aristotle's account of colour and colour perception as his intended solution to what Kalderon calls 'the Empedoclean puzzlement', which results from the apparent tension between two of Empedocles' ideas (p. 6):

1.     the objects of colour perception are qualities of external particulars located at a distance from the perceiver; and

2.     the Empedoclean principle: to be perceptible is to be palpable to sense -- in order for something to be the object of perception it must be in contact with the relevant sense organ.

Empedocles' solution to this puzzlement is an ingestion model of perception, according to which fiery and watery effluences from external objects reach and enter into the fiery and watery pores of our eyes. Aristotle, on the other hand, defends the thesis that colours are qualities which are external, particular, and remote from the perceiver, but does not accept the principle that something is perceptible only if it is in contact with the relevant sense organ. On the contrary, Aristotle thinks that a necessary condition for sensing an object is for that object to be at a distance from the perceiver. Concerning vision, in particular, Aristotle argues that a coloured particular which is placed in immediate contact with our eyes cannot be seen.

But even if Aristotle objects to Empedocles' principle that to be perceptible is to be palpable to sense, he is in agreement with him that perception should be understood as a mode of assimilation. Still, he differs from him on how he understands the mode of assimilation: Empedocles' theory involves effluences emitted by the external particulars that fit into the symmetrical pores of the perceiver's sense organs, whereas Aristotle talks of the assimilation of the sensible forms of remote objects that leave their matter in place. To arrive at an adequate explanation of Aristotle's notion of assimilation, Kalderon systematically examines, in chapters 3 to 7 of his book, the basic elements of Aristotle's theory of vision: transparency (chapter 3), colour (chapter 4), light and dark (chapter 5), the generation of the hues (chapter 6), and the eye (chapter 7).

According to Aristotle, visual perception becomes possible when the colours of external particulars are at a distance and there is a transparent medium between the perceiver and the remote objects. Light is the state that this medium is in when it is actually transparent, and this is due to the presence of a fiery substance. Colour is said to be the power to affect the character of the illuminated medium, by altering the presence of the fiery substance within it. Kalderon draws our attention to the fact that colours for Aristotle are not bodies but powers or states of objects, which implies that they are at best indirectly located, inheriting their location from the objects in which they inhere. In fact, the nature of colours as powers precludes the possibility of their travelling towards the perceiver's sense organ as well as being in contact with it (pp. 51-2). He also stresses that the Aristotelian conception of colours as powers to affect the medium makes no reference to perception. Aristotle is clearly a realist, when he defends the view that objects retain their colours even if not perceived; and since these colours are powers that affect the medium and not directly the perceivers, they are not to be thought of as Lockean secondary qualities (pp. 75-6). Moreover, Aristotle's conception of colours suggests, in Kalderon's view, that coloured particulars possess a material nature that grounds their power to affect the illuminated medium. This leads him to reject Burnyeat's thesis that the medium is not genuinely altered but merely undergoes a quasi-alteration when acted upon by colours. He argues instead that, if colours act upon the medium by promoting or inhibiting the fiery substance illuminating it, that medium undergoes a material change (pp. 80-2).

This is how Kalderon reads Aristotle's theory of colour and colour perception in the De anima; and he explicitly states that this is consistent with what Aristotle has to say about these topics in the De sensu, which should be treated as an extension and not as a substantive revision of the discussion in the De anima (p. 53). More specifically, Kalderon interprets Aristotle's definition of colour in the De sensu as the limit of the transparent to mean that colour is the terminal qualitative state of a progression of qualitative states ordered by decreasing degrees of perceptual penetrability. In other words, Kalderon claims that, in contrast to the transparent medium, the colour of opaque solids is perceptually penetrable to the zeroth degree, and thus defines a visual boundary in which and through which nothing further may be seen (pp. 58-9).

But what is the material nature, the possession of which grounds a particular's power, i.e. its colour, to affect the illuminated medium? Kalderon argues that Aristotle addresses this issue in the De sensu, when he claims that colour resides in the proportion of the transparent that exists in all bodies. For it is precisely the proportion of the transparent that constitutes the material nature underlying a body's visibility, and it is this material nature that the body possesses even in the dark or in the absence of perceivers. So, transparency here should be understood, as Kalderon admits, not in terms of visibility, but rather in terms of the material basis of visibility (pp. 89-90). That is to say, something is transparent to the degree to which it is receptive to the presence of the fiery substance, and this comes down to saying that a body's degree of transparency can be explained in terms of its elemental composition. More specifically, since light is determined by the fiery substance, the presence of fire in a body partly determines its proportion of light and dark which in its turn determines its chromatic hue. For instance, the surface of a red tomato is receptive to the fiery substance to a certain degree, a degree that determines a proportion of light and dark characteristic of red things. Hence, light and dark is what determines the chromatic hue of a particular; and this is why Kalderon goes so far as to suggest that Aristotle's conception of colour can be seen as an ancient prefiguration of modern reflectance theories (pp. 134-6).

Next, Kalderon undertakes to explain the Aristotelian anatomy of the eye. In particular, he discusses how Aristotle's use of the Empedoclean lantern analogy throws light on the other features of the Aristotelian theory of colour perception. Kalderon suggests that Aristotle follows Empedocles in comparing the eye with a lantern not because he thinks it emits fire from its interior, but because he thinks that, in seeing, the interior of the eye is illuminated like a lantern. For Aristotle accepts Empedocles' position that the eye is composed of fire and water, and he also accepts that the exercise of the capacity for sight involves fire in the eye's interior understood, according to Kalderon, as the fiery substance illuminating the internal medium. Since colour is said to be the power to alter what is actually transparent, the eye is also affected by the colour's effect on the transparent medium by itself being transparent, at least in part. Thus, in seeing, the transparent medium within the eye not only is actually transparent, due to the illuminating presence of the fiery substance, but also comes to have a character that corresponds to the character of the illuminated medium as well as of the external particular.

The two concluding chapters (8 and 9) present his interpretation of the De anima's definition of perception as the assimilation of the sensible form of the perceived particular without its matter. According to Aristotle, in cases of qualitative alteration, the patient assimilates the qualitative character of the agent of the alteration. In the case of sensory perception, since what is assimilated is not a body but a quality or a state, the perceiver, or perhaps the perceiver's experience, becomes like the perceived object as it was prior to perception. For instance, prior to seeing the brilliant white of the sun, the perceiver's experience is unlike the sun's whiteness; but in coming to see the sun's whiteness, the perceiver's experience becomes like it. Kalderon in fact stresses that the assimilation of the sun's whiteness consists in the perceiver's experience not becoming actually white, nor being simply caused by the sun's whiteness, but being constitutively shaped by it; and if the perceiver's experience becomes like the perceived object as it actually is, in the sense that it is constitutively shaped by that object, then it is impossible for the perceiver's experience to be as it is and that object be some way other than it actually is (p. 191). The assimilation of sensible form thus underwrites the objectivity of perceptual content, and Kalderon concludes that Aristotle's explanation of perceptual objectivity commits him to the view that perception is presentational and not representational. Indeed, this objectivity of perception is, in Kalderon's view, lost by the early modern theory which denies that our sensory ideas resemble the objects that elicit them and that sensory experience is a mode of qualitative assimilation. Kalderon thinks that this is a disaster and that 'Aristotle was thinking in a better way' (p. 194).

Turning now to my critical comments, the first thing that strikes the reader is the abundance of references to philosophical views of thinkers from all periods in the history of philosophy (e.g. Aquinas, Malebranche, Kant, Nietzsche), as well as to recent and still ongoing philosophical debates. All these are either incorporated in the narrative of the chapters or they are confined in parentheses as suggested bibliography. But what is particularly interesting is the way the author justifies their inclusion; let me give a couple of examples:

1. Aristotle distinguishes between the objects of perception, which are particulars, and the objects of knowledge, which are universal. Kalderon points out that this distinction is echoed by H. A. Prichard in a paragraph of his 1909 book Kant's Theory of Knowledge, which he quotes in full and to which he further adds five bibliographical references to works of contemporary philosophers on the same topic (p. 26).

2. Aristotle refers to the Pythagoreans in connection with his claim that colour lies at the surface of a body but disagrees with them that colour is itself that limit. Kalderon thinks it important to add that Aristotle's opposition to the Pythagorean conception of colour is elaborated after two millennia by Wilfrid Sellars, and thus quotes a relevant paragraph from his 1956 article 'Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind' (p. 59).

Throughout the book, many such quotations are given the role of making Aristotle's allegedly surprising doctrines plausible, by presenting them as distant ancestors of more recent philosophical theories. But are they really illuminating for better understanding Aristotle? Just in a few cases, I think. Many times the inclusion of such references seems superfluous and interrupts the flow of the argument. More importantly, there are occasions when they prove to be uninformative and misleading, especially since the more recent philosophical views or the contemporary debates are presented very briefly and out of context, without the elaboration required for showing their relevance and interpretative significance.

Does this imply, however, that the book is full of distortions and anachronisms? It would be uncharitable to level such a one-sided criticism. By and large, Kalderon provides us with close analyses of the relevant ancient texts, analyses that make use of and engage with the latest interpretations given by Aristotelian scholars. And even if his interest in the Empedoclean and Aristotelian passages could be judged as rather selective, it is worth keeping in mind that Kalderon's proclaimed aim is not a full-blown reconstruction of ancient theories but a defence of his own position on colour and colour perception. Still, the question remains: Are his interpretations reliable? In what follows, I want to focus on some issues -- first, concerning Empedocles' theory of vision and, second, concerning Aristotle's notion of transparency -- in which Kalderon's approach lacks, in my view, the critical scrutiny required for the study of ancient sources.

Kalderon begins his exposition of Empedocles' theory of vision by quoting the well-known passage from Plato's dialogue Meno (76a-d) in which Socrates gives the Empedoclean definition of colour: colour is 'an effluence from shapes commensurate with sight and perceptible to it' (p. 4). Kalderon reads this definition as giving two distinct conditions that must be satisfied for material effluences to be colours: (i) they must be commensurate with sight, and (ii) they must be perceptible. I do not want to comment on the translation which Kalderon uses, here, although I think that his criterion for choosing translations should not have been, as he himself says (p. x), their availability; he should have opted for the translations which he considered best, if he was not willing to do his own. Rather, my point has to do with how Kalderon interprets what he takes to be the second condition. For he stresses that the assimilation of effluences by the organ of sight is not, by itself, the seeing of colours; the effluences must be presented to sight and thereby seen, otherwise the second condition would be redundant. However, the two conditions that Kalderon reads in the Greek text are connected with the conjunctive particle 'and' (kai), which does not have to add a further condition but could be simply an explanation of the previous one; that is, material effluences must be commensurate with sight and this is what makes them perceptible. Besides, he does not explain what this second condition would exactly amount to and, moreover, there are no other texts among the Empedoclean fragments and testimonies that describe such a condition.

My second point concerning Kalderon's account of Empedocles' theory of vision takes issue with his understanding of Theophrastus' testimony (pp. 6-12). There is a dispute among scholars whether Empedocles posits not only effluences of fire from external objects but also from the eyes. According to Kalderon, Theophrastus offers the basis of an explanation why Empedocles would have been committed to the view that fire is also emitted by the organ of sight. For Kalderon thinks that Theophrastus presents Empedocles as saying that the fire emitted by the eyes does not proceed beyond the eyes, but is used for lining the fire passages of the eyes into which the fiery effluences from external objects are supposed to enter. I do not find Kalderon's suggestion convincing for two reasons: first, because Theophrastus does not refer at all to the emission of fire by the eyes; and second, no ancient source seems to corroborate Kalderon's reading that the fire of the eyes creates the bordering lines of its fire passages. In addition, Kalderon's further suggestion that the water passages of the eyes are wider than the fire passages, or that the black effluences from objects are bigger than the white effluences, reminds us of Plato's theory of vision in the Timaeus, but there is no evidence which supports the attribution of such a theory to Empedocles.

A more central place in Kalderon's book is occupied by his account of the Aristotelian notion of transparency (pp. 40-60), for which he professes to make 'some important claims of interpretation' (p. ix). There is no doubt that this topic is fundamental for our understanding of Aristotle's theory of colour and colour perception, and I think that Kalderon's approach is overall very helpful in identifying the complexities involved and in pointing to the right direction for their understanding. Still, there are some unsettled issues.

According to Aristotle, the medium between the perceiver and the objects of perception is actually transparent not due to its nature, but due to the presence of a fiery substance. In his attempt to figure out the nature of this fiery substance, Kalderon assumes that insofar as it pervades a material medium, such as a body of air or water, it cannot itself be a body since two bodies cannot occupy the same space according to Aristotle's principles of physics. So, Kalderon seems compelled to understand the presence of the fiery substance as the occurrence of an incorporeal activity, a kind of rarefied burning that instantaneously pervades the medium insofar as it is a unity. To support such an interpretation, he also presupposes that Aristotle adheres to some extent to Heraclitus' metaphysics which postulates that for fire, at least, to be is to burn (pp. 43-4). I find Kalderon's account of the fiery substance as an incorporeal activity very problematic. He is right that the continual presence of the fiery substance is required for the transparency of the medium to persist, but this fiery substance does not have to pervade the medium; it is enough for it to be present, so that it affects the potentially transparent medium, and thus there is no need to think of it as incorporeal.

In general, I agree with Kalderon that the conception of transparency as presented by Aristotle in the De anima is consistent with the way the same notion is discussed in the De sensu. Kalderon manages to reconcile the definition of transparency in the De anima in terms of the manner of its visibility, namely that something is transparent when it is not visible in itself but owes its visibility to the colour of something else, with the account of colour in the De sensu as the limit of the transparency in determinately bounded bodies. For Kalderon is right to point out that the surface colour of opaque solid bodies is the limit of transparency in the sense that it is the terminal qualitative state through which nothing further can be seen. But he is also right to notice that, when Aristotle states in the De sensu that all bodies are transparent to some degree, transparency should not be understood in terms of visibility but rather in terms of the material basis of visibility, which comes down to saying that something is transparent to the degree to which it is receptive to the presence of the fiery substance. How do the two accounts accord with each other? And what does it really mean for an opaque solid to be receptive to the presence of the fiery substance? Kalderon does not explain these issues in detail, and this is not the place to present my own views on the subject; I should point out, though, that I find his analogy with modern reflectance theories unhelpful.

Do my criticisms suggest that I was at the end disappointed after having read this book, as Kalderon fears in his preface (p. x)? Not at all. It is admittedly not easy to please at the same time both philosophers of perception and historians of philosophy studying Aristotle's psychology, but this book proves to be for both groups thought-provoking as well as refreshing. By taking a distance from the ancient texts and examining them in a new light, it raises interesting issues of historical interpretation and of philosophical content. But one should be cautious towards readings of Aristotle's theories that follow a specific paradigm. As Kalderon himself points out (p. ix), the Aristotelian philosophy of mind is no longer credible, in Burnyeat's view, because Aristotle fails to adhere to the modern paradigm; Kalderon, on the other hand, thinks that it is credible exactly because Aristotle does not follow the modern paradigm. Perhaps it makes more sense to read Aristotle without being trapped by paradigms; that's the best way to learn from our predecessors, which is after all what Kalderon initially wanted to do. No doubt, the issues involved in the historiography of ancient philosophy are too complicated to solve in this review, but this book certainly raises them.