Formal Theories of Truth

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JC Beall, Michael Glanzberg, and David Ripley, Formal Theories of Truth, Oxford University Press, 2018, 138pp., $20.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780198815686.

Reviewed by Riccardo Bruni, University of Florence


This volume comes in a handy pocket-size which, if I had been asked before reading it, I would have thought unfit for the subject it treats. The study of formal truth is a highly specialized area of logically driven research that, despite the catchy appearance of some of the issues to which it is related and its clear philosophical flavour, cannot be approached without the appropriate technical expertise. A “jungle”, the authors of this volume call it. But in fact, I was wrong.

As the authors explain, the book in its current form comes out of a failed attempt to pursue a different goal: to write an exhaustive critical survey of formal theories of truth. The original aim was then replaced with that of providing researchers who have a little training in formal logic with a “bridge” to help them to take “a first step” into this area of work. Not that this new goal is easier than the original one. Quite the contrary, the very intricateness of the subject makes it harder to properly select the right topics to provide a substantial and informative picture of the state-of-the-art in the field and to present the material in a way that will be clear to the non-expert. As anticipated, I found that authors did a good job in both respects.

Chapter 1 explains the main aim of the volume and gives indications about how the subsequent chapters have been conceived. Some few significant words are devoted to explaining why the study of truth and the study of logic go together. This is the authors’ attempt to motivate the investigation of truth by means of the formal methods of logic. The key concept here is “paradoxes”: fallacious forms of reasoning involving obvious principles of truth as well as obvious principles of logic make clear that one or the other must be replaced or abandoned. The observation is connected with the way the book proceeds, as the authors will make use of (mostly) the Liar paradox to illustrate both the issues from which the whole investigation of formal truth takes its origin, as well as to justify the different routes that have been taken in the attempt to find the remedy.

Chapter 2 is therefore devoted to truth-theoretic paradoxes or, as the subtitle reads, to “a select sampling” of them. The explanation and a brief discussion of the Liar paradox is what is mostly taken care of. The paradox as it is commonly known at the informal level is first presented and used to show why the formulation of a sentence that speaks of its own falsity is problematic. Then, the difference between the plain “falsity Liar” and the “untruth Liar”, which is built around a sentence that says that it itself is untrue, is made clear. Three more issues are then used to motivate the use of the Liar paradox as paradigmatic of problematic reasoning involving truth: the possibility of constructing such reasoning by means of only indirect forms of self-reference; the use of Liar-like sentences to construct more complex propositions by boolean combinations; paradoxes based upon no apparent self-reference like Stephen Yablo’s famous case. A brief note with essential bibliographical references about other types of paradoxes ends the chapter.

Chapter 3 then focuses on the Liar paradox in an attempt to clarify its elements, with particular attention to which are of a truth-theoretic nature, and which are of a logical nature. The aim is to devise a formal version of the paradox that may serve as reference for the rest of the volume. This is a delicate matter, requiring both a careful selection of the technical aspects to treat and an equally cautious choice of what to say of them and what to take for granted. The chapter seems well-balanced in both respects: the basic principles of “capture” and “release” (sometimes known in the literature as “necessitation” and “co-necessitation”), which regulate the application of truth in a formal setting, are discussed; then, the authors briefly introduce the problem of the existence of the Liar sentence at the formal level, stress the other logical laws that are important to consider, and finally present the formal version of the Liar by taking notice of which principle is used where. This very basic formal analysis of the paradox presupposes only familiarity with the standard logical notation.

Having so quickly proceeded from the informal to the formal version of the paradox, chapter 4 steps back a little and goes deeper into considering some of the problematic aspects that have been left unnoticed. The content of the chapter varies, as the authors themselves have to admit, as they consider both conceptual as well as technical issues. All of them are rather familiar to scholars in this field. For instance, the chapter discusses the notion of truth that is presupposed along the way, particularly for what concerns its connection to a satisfaction relation between terms and (open) sentences of a language. The subsequent section discusses another topic of interest when paradoxes like the Liar are concerned, namely the need to find terms #A that work as “names” for sentences A. Three main strategies are reviewed: the first presumes that among the primitive tools of a language there is a citation device that produces such terms out of its own sentences; the second deploys the existence of bijections between the set of terms and the set of formulas, due to the fact that they both are denumerably many, and lets names for sentences coincide with the image of elements of the latter set into the former; and the third employs the well-known assignment of numerical codes to formulas which allows, for every formal language that contains arithmetical symbols, the identification of names for formulas with numerals corresponding to their codes. For all of these approaches to the problem, both advantages and disadvantages with respect to the formal study of truth are discussed. There is also a brief account of compositional principles of truth, which, notoriously, have a form that formal principles of truth can take. Finally, the authors survey the two ways by which the consequence relation between a set of hypotheses and the conclusion that is drawn from them can be defined. As is known, this relation can either follow the definition of a semantics according to which sentences of a formal language “hold”, and set the consequence relation to reflect the transmission of this validity condition from the hypotheses to the conclusion, or can be obtained from a definition that reflects a relation of proof between them.

The subsequent three chapters of the book, 5, 6 and 7, contain the backbone of the information that the volume provides. Chapter 5 develops an articulated picture of the idea that, granted that the Lair paradox shows the inconsistency between certain truth-theoretical principles and some other logical assumptions, the latter ones must go and a non-classical logical stance must be assumed. The chapter presents approaches of this kind that remain faithful to a deflationist view of truth according to which A is intersubstitutable with T(#A). The crucial tool here is the Kleene-Kripke fixed point model. This proposal is explained in both of its components: Kleene’s strong three-valued logic and Kripke’s construction that allows the expansion of a Kleene model of a formal language into a model that also provides an interpretation of its truth predicate. The subsequent section is devoted to exploring the ways in which a consequence relation can be defined out of the Kleene-Kripke schema. Two alternatives are considered, the logic K3TT, where the law of excluded middle fails (hence, referred to as a “paracomplete” approach) and the logic LPTT, where the principle of ex-falso quodlibet (“explosion” as it is named here) fails, which allows this logic to be seen as a “paraconsistent” proposal instead. Most importantly, the two views are presented by making use of the concept of “designated values”, which labels those values which count in determining countermodels to arguments, and hence, symmetrically, their models too. This is particularly useful for the discussion of the two logics that follows, and which dismisses some common but deceptive presentations of them. After briefly mentioning two additional ways of defining a consequence relation out of the Kleene-Kripke schema, the authors discusses the issue of extra-conditionals. This is known to be a hot topic for those who aim at exploiting fixed points to develop a formal theory of truth. This is because, while Kripke’s construction is faithful to the deflationist stance since A and T(#A) get the same semantic value, neither of the two consequence relations are capable of reflecting this fact by validating the corresponding schema of logical equivalence, as long as the latter is formulated by means of material implication. The section surveys the problem of extending the language with a dedicated new conditional by both stressing motivations and constraints, as well as by mentioning actual attempts made in this respect. The chapter ends with a presentation of some popular objections raised against the views considered, most notably the departure from classical logic which naturally leads to the next topic of the book.

Chapter 6 is indeed devoted to survey approaches which start from a contrary analysis of the difficulties related to the Liar paradox: it is not the logic that needs to be changed, it is the truth principles that are to be restricted instead. As is known, the most renowned approach to formal truth which maintains classical logic is based on Tarski’s hierarchy of languages (Li)iϵI, where the language at each “level” i is equipped with the truth predicate for all, and only the languages preceding it. The authors summarize the motivations for this approach, its formal development, and the objections raised against it. The three sections that follow are dedicated to ways in which Tarski’s idea is used to develop truth theories. In particular, the authors explore proof-theoretic approaches that aim at reconciling classical logic and restricted forms of the capture and release principles to yield consistent theories, considering the cases of Friedman-Sheard FS and of Feferman’s system KF. The authors then describe the way in which the same attempt is pursued via semantical means, i.e. by using the Kleene-Kripke schema to produce partial models of a language containing its own truth predicate. Finally, They discuss contextualist approaches which are based on the assumption that the pathological behaviour of a sentence like the Liar sentence can be explained by its dependence on the context that is used to fix its semantic values (different contexts allowing the sentence to take different semantic values). The account of contextualist views explores motivations, formal development, varieties of forms, advantages and objections. The chapter ends with a brief mention of the issue of determinacy.

Chapter 7 explores the approach to truth-theoretic paradoxes which acts upon the structural rules which contribute to defining proofs in a classical setting. As is known, these rules get emphasized if a proof-theoretic approach using sequents is deployed, and a suitable presentation of calculi based upon them is given here. Then, two ways of approaching formal truth from a “substructural” point of view are presented: a non-transitive approach, which consists in rejecting the cut rule, and a non-contractive approach, which refuses full validity to the rule of contraction. Following a path similar to the previous chapters, the authors go on considering advantages and critical aspects of the two views. Among favourable features of substructural approaches, particularly important are those which allow them to mark the distance from the non-classical ones: going substructural is one way to get rid of paradoxes by adhering most closely to the classical view. Attention is paid to the clash between non-transitive and non-contractive views and the cumulative model of reasoning, according to which the very process of drawing conclusions from certain premises justifies the addition of the former to the original set of hypotheses and lets the process proceed further. The problematic features of this model for both non-transitivists and non-contractivists are clarified and discussed.

As I said, chapter 7 completes the core of the information conveyed by the book. There is one more chapter, devoted to other directions of research. One is a radical reconsideration of one of the aspects which most, if not all, formal theories of truth take for granted or leave aside from their theoretical scope, namely the idea that paradoxes, while calling for a “solution” at the deeper level of analysis which a theory of truth should pursue, are unproblematic at the level of the natural language. “Inconsistency theories” is the label that applies to all those approaches that are characterized by the contrary view that paradoxes pose indeed a serious problem to natural languages themselves. Beside reviewing the motivation of such a position, the authors devote some space to explaining the different forms into which the original idea has been shaped, as well as to clarifying its relation to other views. Another approach discussed is the revision theory of truth, which distinguishes itself for being now presented as an approach that helps to deal with circular definitions in general. The authors mention this as they survey the rationale for the theory, sketch a formal picture of it and briefly consider objections.

Besides being well-structured, the book is also well-written and in a style that is effective and clear enough to accomplish the task the authors have set. The book is also equipped with an essential but sufficiently rich bibliography, to which the authors carefully refer and which will provide those who will dare enter the “jungle of truth theories” and make their way through it with the proper tools to survive.