Forming Humanity: Redeeming the German Bildung Tradition

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Jennifer A. Herdt, Forming Humanity: Redeeming the German Bildung Tradition, University of Chicago Press, 2019, 329pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226618487.

Reviewed by Timothy Stoll, Franklin and Marshall College


The German word Bildung is notoriously difficult to render in English. Its most common meaning is perhaps 'education,' though in a more capacious sense than what happens exclusively in schools and universities. It is related to the German for 'image' (Bild) and the verb meaning 'to form, shape, construct' (bilden), and so suggests, when applied to a human being, a kind of quasi-aesthetic formation of one's character. The complexities and ambiguities of the term provide a considerable obstacle to those interested in late eighteenth and early nineteenth-century German ethical thought, in which the ideal of Bildung plays a crucial role. In this splendid book, Jennifer Herdt has thus provided a valuable service in tracing the ways in which the concept of Bildung figures in the work of some of the most prominent thinkers of the period. With verve and impressive erudition, Herdt details how the notion of Bildung originated in the German pietist movement in the seventeenth century, and blossomed into a more (though perhaps not entirely) humanistic ideal in the subsequent work of Herder, Wilhelm von Humboldt, Schiller, Goethe, and Hegel. Though these figures differ in many crucial respects, they are united by the idea that human beings are "oriented toward a telos conceived as the harmonious development of all their various capacities . . . into a balanced, unified whole" (p. 82).

This, in a nutshell, is what Herdt calls the "Bildung tradition." From what, then, does it need to be redeemed? Herdt's study is centered around responding to two sorts of related criticisms. One criticism, broadly in the tradition of post-colonial theory, holds that "the project of Bildung is bound up with racism, justifications of slavery, colonialism, imperialism, and the origins of National Socialism" (p. 13). The worry is that viewing humanity as an achievement rather than something "given" risks treating some human beings -- usually, non-Europeans -- as "merely vestigially human, or as immature, perhaps permanently so" (p. 13). The second criticism, to which the book devotes more attention, is indebted to the Protestant theologian Karl Barth. Barth's concern is with an excessive optimism about the powers of human reason and agency, which he dubs "human autarchy," and which supposedly characterizes the Bildung tradition. Barth worries that this "autarchy" leaves no room for divine revelation, providence, or grace, wrongly treating human beings as "the measure of all things." Additionally, he holds that it threatens to pave over, and perhaps license suppression of, human differences. Herdt's goal is not to show that these criticisms entirely miss their mark, but she does wish to suggest that the Bildung tradition has ample, albeit sometimes imperfectly developed, resources for meeting them.

The first two chapters concern the complex origins of the notion of Bildung. From the Greek concept of paideía, the Bildung tradition inherited the ideal of "a harmonious development of all human capacities" (p. 32). If the basic shape of their ideal hailed from antiquity, the vocabulary in which the Bildung tradition discussed that ideal owes more to certain strains of Christian thought. Here, the connection between Bildung, Bild and bilden becomes especially important. According to a tradition that runs from Meister Eckhart through Luther to Paracelsus, to say that human beings are created "in the image of God" is to say that they have a natural capacity and obligation to become similar to God in the most essential respects. In this sense, "humanity" becomes a goal to be realized by forming (or re-forming) oneself away from sin and towards one's true nature. And this is accomplished, at least in large part, by turning away from the influences of the external world and culture on us, and searching for the divine "model" (Vorbild) within. Pietist authors in the early seventeenth century -- Herdt focuses primarily on Johann Arndt and Jakob Böhme -- inherited this line of thought, and laid the foundations of the Bildung tradition in two ways. First, by placing emphasis on intense introspection (aided by the reading of spiritual autobiographies) as a means for discerning one's spiritual state, they provided a general model of self-formation that could be appropriated and transformed by more secular authors. Second, by conceiving of Bildung as a process at work throughout all of nature, Böhme in particular set the theoretical stage for the organicist views of Herder and Hegel.

Herdt's treatment of the Bildung tradition proper begins in Chapter 3 with an examination of the work of Herder. Herder sees Bildung not just as the end of humanity but as a process at work throughout nature, whereby organisms realize their natural capacities. Indeed, along broadly Spinozistic lines, he conceives of nature and history as a whole as part of the process of divine self-realization with human Bildung at its summit. Though optimistic, Herder's teleological conception of history raises a concern: does it not risk legitimizing human evils as necessary parts of this process? In particular, does it not license allegedly more cultivated societies treating those allegedly less cultivated as inferior? Here, Herdt's discussion of Herder's views on race and national identity are of special interest. Herder is something like an anti-realist about race avant la lettre. He is also a champion of historical particularity, arguing that each culture must express itself in own unique way, and that the perfection of the human race consists in a harmony amongst (not at the cost of) these differences. He is accordingly staunchly opposed to imperialism and holds that it is wrong for one culture to impose its own standards on another. "Herder's ideal of humanity," Herdt argues, is thus "not an assertion of autocratic humanism, not an imperialistic imposition of false universality" (p. 109), even if it could be, and was, misappropriated in this way.

Chapter 4 turns to more straightforwardly secular representatives of the Bildung tradition, focusing primarily on Humboldt and Schiller. For these thinkers, culture and art take up the role formerly assigned (e.g., by Herder) to God. Humboldt and Schiller share an ideal of harmonious development of the individual's diverse capacities, and in particular a harmony between rationality and sensuality. For Humboldt, a republican state alone makes it possible for its members to achieve Bildung, giving them the freedom and resources to develop. For Schiller, by contrast, Bildung is a precondition of the free state. He holds that both reason and sense should be harmonized in such a way that, as Herdt puts it, "the moral law is no longer experienced as an external constraint but is embraced as that to which the aesthetically formed are inclined" (p. 128). As the horrors of the French Revolution showed, only a citizenry educated in this way could be expected to sustain its political freedom. Herdt believes Barth's criticisms are more aptly applied here; allegedly unlike Herder, "neither [Schiller nor Humboldt] sees fellowship-in-difference as itself the realization of humanity" (p. 131).

Chapters 5 and 6 change gears slightly, focusing on the literary genre of the Bildungsroman. Chapter 5 argues that the Bildungsroman grew out of the earlier genre of pietist autobiography. This new kind of novel was, in Herdt's view, a kind of "secular scripture," which used the inner emotional life and spiritual development of its protagonist to present models for the achievement of Bildung. Chapter 6 provides a case study in the form of a detailed reading of Goethe's Wilhelm Meisters Lehrjahre -- a book which reveals the limits as much as it embodies the central aspirations of the Bildungsroman. On balance, the novel depicts Wilhelm as more a passive than active agent in his own education. This reflects Goethe's view that each individual possesses an immanent form that will unfold if she is placed in the appropriate environment. The novel's lesson, if it has one, is that "the ideal of humanity can only be collectively . . . only communally, realized" (p. 181). There is a note of irony in the fact that Wilhelm is only depicted as close to achieving Bildung when he ceases to be focused on his own self-realization, and is instead absorbed in concern for others. Wilhelm Meiser, in Herdt's view, thus contains an implicit critique of the individualist strains running throughout much of the Bildung tradition.

The final chapter is devoted to Hegel. Herdt shows convincingly that the notion of Bildung is a common unifying thread throughout much of Hegel's system, running from his aesthetics and critique of the modern novel, through his metaphysics, philosophy of religion, and social-political philosophy. Herdt has interesting things to say about all of these topics, but the last two seem most germane to the overall arc of her narrative. As is well-known, Hegel believes, very roughly, that history is teleologically organized around and towards the realization of something he calls the "concept," and which is identified in some manner with God. This picture is often attacked for courting political complacency at best, and justifying human evils -- those of slavery and imperialism in particular -- as necessary stages in God's self-actualization at worst. Hegel does not hold, however, that this process happens "automatically"; free human agents must play a role in completing it. For this reason, what is necessary to divine Bildung is only the possibility of evil, not its actuality. Hegel can thus attribute the latter to human agency alone, and so is not committed to condoning it. Herdt does not ignore Hegel's more troubling pronouncements on race. She emphasizes that he holds Africans, e.g., to be in a state of arrested spiritual development, and that imperialism is justified to the extent that it introduces them to culture. Her point is that this problematic view is not entailed by Hegel's core philosophical commitments, indeed, that it stems from his own "failure . . . to apply . . . his insistence that critique be brought to bear on social and political institutions premised on failures of recognition" (p. 227).

Despite what seems to me its overall success in responding to the criticisms glossed above, the book's orientation around Barth nevertheless strikes me as somewhat regrettable. On one level, this is because Barth's concerns, at least as Herdt presents them, often seem amorphous and insufficiently motivated. And, Herdt's protestations to the contrary notwithstanding (e.g., p. 16), their probative force frequently seems contingent on the acceptance of a good deal of Protestant theology. More importantly, the emphasis on Barth's critique distracts, I believe, from a number of tensions internal to the ideal of Bildung itself, which pose their own serious problems for the tradition. In order to see them, it will help to distinguish three core features of Bildung, all of which (correctly, I believe) play some important role in Herdt's narrative, although she does not explicitly separate them. They are: (1) the complete development of all one's capacities, (2) some kind of unity or harmony between those capacities, and (3) the autonomy of the agent who is called to develop her capacities in those ways. Once these features are explicitly distinguished, it becomes clear that they are not obviously mutually implying, and indeed that pursuing some may require sacrificing others.

Consider, for instance, the relation between (1) and (2). If we assume that it is a minimal requirement on harmonious agency that one's capacities at least not lead one into conflict with oneself, then a sure way to maximize unity would presumably be to leave many of those capacities underdeveloped. Moreover, harmony seems to require not just absence of conflict, but integration of one's capacities, and this too may place limits on their development. Here, one may think of Goethe, who himself served his contemporaries and many subsequent admirers as an exemplar of Bildung. What must have struck Nietzsche, when he observed that Goethe "combatted the cleavage between reason, sensuality, feeling, and will,"[1] was the way in which Goethe's various projects -- literary, scientific, artistic, political -- not only peacefully coexisted, but seemed to bleed into and mutually inform one another. It was, for instance, Goethe's forays into painting that led him to develop his theory of colors, and his literary genius which aided him in developing his unique method of describing natural phenomena. Yet, one cannot help feeling that such harmony could only come at the expense of further cultivation: a more single-minded dedication to scientific inquiry, e.g., would likely have produced a better scientist, but one less in tune with the artist.

Similar tensions arise between (1) and (2), on the one hand, and (3) on the other. Schiller in particular is keenly aware of and struggles with this fact. Herdt's emphasis in her discussion of Schiller is on the Aesthetic Letters, where the ideal of unity is especially prominent. She does not note, however, that at least by the time Schiller comes to write "Concerning the Sublime," if not already in "Grace and Dignity," he recognizes that this ideal sits somewhat uneasily alongside his Kantian conception of autonomy as the determination of one's actions by practical reason. His worry is that the more we develop our sensuous capacities, the greater the risk of heteronomy; too strong a desire for unity may inadvertently lead to violations of the moral law when its demands conflict with inclination. In such cases, Schiller is firmly on the side of reason, even to the point of apparently inveighing against his own earlier ideal: "Away, then, with the . . . frail, pampered taste that . . . lies about some sort of harmony between well-being and good behavior, a harmony of which there are no traces in the real world."[2] Schiller's point here is that (2) is never fully achievable -- it is always possible for reason and inclination to come into conflict -- and so securing the capacity to act autonomously in such cases must have some kind of priority over the ideal of unity. (Incidentally, this fact speaks against Herdt's claim that Schiller is a proponent of "autarchy." Schiller is perfectly aware of the limitations of our powers for self-formation; it is precisely because we are not omnipotent that we cannot expect desire and obligation to always coincide, and that we must be prepared to respect the humanity of others even when that comes at the cost of personal sacrifice.)

The main fault lines along which Herdt sees the Bildung tradition divided mainly concern questions of whether human agency is sufficient to achieve Bildung, and whether the project is an individualistic or a more communal one. Another, to my mind more illuminating, way of locating the core disagreements within the tradition would focus on the questions of how to respond to the above tensions, and (assuming that the tensions cannot be entirely eliminated) which of (1)-(3) to privilege. One way, for instance, to avoid Schiller's problems would be to renounce his Kantian theory of autonomy, and to instead locate freedom in becoming an individual, in the sense of someone genuinely and interestingly unique. In this way, (3) would arguably be contained in (1), if 'all capacities' comprises not only those shared amongst all human beings but also those peculiar to the individual. This, as Beiser has argued,[3] was characteristic of the early romantics' conception of Bildung. With the romantics also comes a much greater skepticism about the centrality of practical reason to ethical life than anything we find in Schiller. Schlegel, in what must be an implicit attack on Schiller, extolls the individual who "no longer does anything for the sake of duty, but does everything from love, merely because one wants to . . . because God -- the God in us -- says it."[4] It is surprising that Herdt does not treat the romantics at all, since they both exercised a major influence on Hegel, with whom her narrative culminates, and departed crucially from, even as they were inspired by, their predecessors in the Bildung tradition.

Any book with the scope of Forming Humanity must of course make difficult decisions about where to lay emphasis and what to omit. Even if one can quibble with some of Herdt's choices, as I have done here, that should do little to detract from the achievement involved in synthesizing and crafting an engaging narrative about this unduly neglected philosophical tradition.

[1] Friedrich Nietzsche, Sämtliche Werke, vol. 6, eds. Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari (Berlin: de Gruyter, 1999), 151.  

[2] Friedrich Schiller, Essays, eds. Walter Hinderer and Daniel Dahlstrom (New York: Continuum, 1993), 83.

[3] Frederick Beiser, The Romantic Imperative: the Concept of Early German Romanticism (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2003), 99.

[4] Friedrich Schlegel, Schriften zur kritischen Philosophie: 1795-1805 (Hamburg: Meiner, 2007), 79.