Forms and Structure in Plato’s Metaphysics

Forms And Structure In Plato S Metaphysics

Anna Marmodoro, Forms and Structure in Plato’s Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2021, 223pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197577158.

Reviewed by Evan Rodriguez, Idaho State University


In this expansive book, Anna Marmodoro applies insights from her previous work on Anaxagoras, Aristotle, and contemporary metaphysics to offer a new interpretation of Plato’s metaphysics. Marmodoro uses the language of contemporary metaphysics not only to illuminate her understanding of Plato, but also to argue that Plato’s positions are worth taking seriously from a contemporary perspective.

Marmodoro’s method is to engage only selectively with the scholarly literature, and to prioritize an independent assessment of the main puzzles and comparisons that motivate some of the metaphysical discussions in Plato’s dialogues. This requires several caveats concerning the relevant studies that are discussed only minimally or not at all.  Relatedly, she assesses individual passages in Plato’s dialogues on their own merits, setting aside their dialogical form as “of mainly stylistic rather than philosophical interest” and considering passages “irrespectively of who is speaking in the dialogue and in what dialectical context” (10–11). This allows Marmodoro to focus on her own reconstruction of the inspiration that Plato derives from Anaxagoras and the subsequent development of ancient Greek metaphysics. Below I offer first a brief summary of Marmodoro’s reconstruction, then a more detailed discussion of the book’s contents.

According to Marmodoro, Plato is a power ontologist who shares much of his metaphysical outlook with Anaxagoras. Anaxagoras, she argues, posited his so-called “Opposites” as powers, parts of which are present in individual objects.  The Opposites thus overlap with individual objects, what Marmodoro calls “constitutional overlap,” and are the cause of those objects bearing the properties they do, what she calls “constitutional causation.” Plato, too, appeals to constitutional overlap and constitutional causation to explain the properties of sensible objects, with the important difference that  he posits non-physical Forms in place of Anaxagoras’ Opposites. Plato then extends this basic mechanism to account for relations and for necessity. Marmodoro also posits a radical shift in Plato’s development, which is where the “structure” of Marmodoro’s title comes into play most prominently: he changes his metaphysical model first in the Sophist and then again in the Timaeus in order to properly account for the structured world we live in. Plato thereby abandons constitutional overlap as his basic explanatory tool, replacing it with the idea of imitation and the activity of a divine agent. Relatedly, he first tries positing a new set of second-order Forms, the Great Kinds, then changes tack in the Timaeus with a single uber-Form, the paradeigma. Nevertheless, other aspects of the radically new metaphysics of the Timaeus are thoroughly Anaxagorean, including Plato’s positing a separate principle (the demiurge or cosmic craftsman, analogous to nous or intelligence in Anaxagoras) that is responsible, among other things, for setting the sensible world in motion.

The first two chapters (just shy of a third of the book) offer a whirlwind tour of Anaxagoras’ metaphysics. They are drawn from Marmodoro’s 2017 monograph, some parts verbatim according to the introduction. The basic story is that Anaxagoras appeals to three different types of entities: the Opposites, spatially located powers that constitute individual objects; seeds, primitive structures that organize the opposites into more complex organisms; and nous, a power of intelligence that sets in motion a cosmic vortex that in turn accounts for the variety we see in the world. I would have been interested to hear more about why, on her view, Anaxagoras could not have accounted for structure with nous alone, which she says is responsible for meta-structure, but not first-order structure (the latter being the role of the seeds). Marmodoro argues that the seeds must not be reducible to the Opposites, otherwise there would be no way to account for their structure (18). But again, why not think that nous can play the role of structuring Opposites into both first- and second-order structures? Marmodoro is concerned that structure, and the organisms it forms, must not be created ex nihilo due to a Parmenidean stricture against coming to be (45). But Anaxagoras does have nous aggregate opposites into stuffs such as earth or flesh without it thereby committing him to new ontological entities (37, 44–45). Why not say the same for organisms? In any case, what will prove most important for understanding Plato’s Anaxagoreanism is the idea of constitutional overlap, motivated by what Marmodoro calls the “contagion principle.” The idea here is that the cause of f-ness must itself be f, and the effect becomes f through the “contagion” of its cause. Anaxagoras conceives of the cause as physically transmitting shares of f-ness, while Plato allows for non-physical transmission.

Before turning to Plato, Marmodoro has an issue to address: if Plato’s metaphysics is so thoroughly Anaxagorean, why not discuss Anaxagoras more often in the dialogues? And why, moreover, does he have Socrates criticize Anaxagoras at such length in the Phaedo? In a short appendix to Chapter 2, Marmodoro suggests that the criticism is genuine: Plato mistakenly saw Anaxagoras’ system as lacking the resources needed to explain intentional action. The fact that Plato does not have Socrates criticize other elements of the system, however, she sees as an implicit sign of approval. This is one of the places where I thought more discussion of the context (both dialogical and historical) could help strengthen Marmodoro’s case. Christopher Moore, for example, has suggested a historical association between Socrates and Anaxagoras that Plato, and to a greater extent Xenophon, were downplaying because of its political connotations (2019).

Marmodoro then turns to Plato’s metaphysics, where she offers a new developmental story with three periods. The first period covers the majority of the dialogues, most importantly the Phaedo. Plato then experiments with new developments in the Sophist (period two), then abandons them for a new system in the Timaeus (period three). Chapters 3–5 (and some of Chapter 6) cover the first period of Plato’s development. The central claim of Chapter 3 is that Plato’s Forms are powers and thus Plato, like Anaxagoras, is a power ontologist. Marmodoro’s central evidence for this claim is a passage from the Sophist that expresses what has been dubbed the Eleatic Principle, namely that only powers exist (more on this below). Plato, like Anaxagoras, conceives of powers as active and unchanging rather than as mere potentialities which can transition from being inactive to being active or manifest. Relatedly, both Anaxagoras and Plato see their powers not as efficient causes but rather as qualifying objects by their constitutional presence, that is by objects possessing a share of the relevant power. In other words, Plato’s Forms, like Anaxagoras’ Opposites, are constitutional causes. A key difference between the two is that the Forms are transcendent; more specifically, Marmodoro endorses what Gail Fine has called a “two-worlds theory” where the Forms exist in their own separate place (75–79). Generalizing from the case of geometry, Plato maintains that the transcendent holds a normativity over the physical, and thus does not need to give any further account of how transcendent forms can qualify physical objects (77–82).

There is a potentially confusing typographical error where the Eleatic Principle is introduced. It reads: “EP: Those things which amount to nothing other than power” (66). I believe what was intended was a translation of 247e3–4 of the Sophist  as follows: “Those things which are amount to nothing other than power.” This could make the principle harder to understand for readers not already familiar with the Sophist. There is also a tension, though no outright contradiction, in the fact that this key evidence for Plato’s early ontology comes from what is a much later dialogue on Marmodoro’s account, one where Plato is changing aspects of his earlier theory (though not this aspect). Furthermore, it comes in a dialectical context where the Eleatic Stranger is speaking on behalf of the so-called Giants. The Giants occupy a position that is being opposed to the Form theorists introduced just afterwards. This is one place where I would have found more discussion of the issue helpful, both to flag a controversial claim for those unfamiliar with the debate and to explain the interpretation being taken here to those who are familiar with it. Marmodoro does mention a dispute over whether this is meant as a definition or a mere mark of being, but does not discuss the more fundamental issue of whether we should take this view, however construed, to be endorsed by the author (66).

Chapter 4 engages with criticisms of the views that Marmodoro attributes to Plato within the dialogues, interpreting them as him wrestling with Anaxagoras’ views and their imperfect fit with his own theory of Forms. Again, Plato endorses the model of constitutional overlap and constitutional causation. Yet, already in his early period, he sees potential problems with Anaxagoras’ view and his own. In the Lysis, he raises a problem for constitutional overlap based on a distinction between a property being present in an object (such as white lead present in hair) and a property fully belonging to that object (such as hair whitened by old age). Yet, since Plato has no alternative to offer, he still endorses the Anaxagorean model while being noncommittal about the exact mechanism for participation or communion. Marmodoro focuses on a number of potential problems that are raised in the dialogues for the theory of Forms: the Third Bed Argument, the Partaking Dilemma, the Paradox of Smallness, and the Third Man Argument (the first from the Republic and the latter three from the Parmenides). The Third Man Argument in particular becomes important for later chapters, as Marmodoro argues that we do not get a full solution until the Timaeus. One upshot of considering these puzzles is that Plato comes to conceive of his Forms as operating functionally rather than by preponderance as is the case for Anaxagoras’ Opposites. Another is that Plato has to deal with a tension between his Forms being immutable and their having parts. Plato’s Forms undergo what Marmodoro calls “Cambridge partitioning.” Like Cambridge change, an entity can undergo Cambridge partitioning without thereby being affected by the partition.

Chapter 5 contains an extended discussion of Plato’s mereology, one of the areas where Marmodoro suggests contemporary metaphysics can learn from a careful study of Plato’s views. She begins the chapter with four useful criteria for Forms: distributiveness, uniqueness, incompositeness, and uniformity (114). Others have suggested that Forms can be understood as strongly unified wholes while still in some sense having parts. Marmodoro argues that forms are “logical fusions” of their parts, analogous to Anaxagoras’ Opposites in that their individuation conditions remain the same even when divided (the more concrete analogy used here is “stuffs” such as gold or water). She focuses on the discussion of mereology in Plato’s Theaetetus; embedded in this discussion are two different accounts which, once we understand the background of Plato’s metaphysics as Marmodoro does, alternately describe the part-whole relationship exhibited by sensible objects and the part-whole relationship exhibited by the more strongly unified Forms. This leads to what Marmodoro understands as a distinct form of hylomorphism, “Platonic hylomorphism,” where the parts of certain complexes “vanish” into a partless whole. The chapter ends with a reconsideration of the Third Man Argument. The underlying problem is what Marmodoro dubs “the becoming of being,” the idea that a Form, e.g., the Hot, must itself somehow become hot in order for there to be an adequate explanation of such self-predication. The solution, on this view, comes in Plato’s Timaeus, where Plato realizes that he can posit the Form as primitively hot (as Anaxagoras already did with his Opposites).

Chapter 6 details ways in which Plato extends Anaxagoras’ model of constitutional overlap and changes his own theory to better account for structure. The first step is to argue that Plato needs multiple accounts of participation for Forms to do all the work they are meant to do. Beyond an individual sensible object partaking in a Form, Marmodoro suggests that Plato develops two types of plural partaking. In “joint-partaking” two or more individuals jointly partake in a single Form (for example, two individuals can jointly partake in the Form of Twoness). In “parallel-partaking” different individuals partake in different Forms in parallel (for example, when one individual partakes in the Form of Largeness in parallel with another individual partaking in the Form of Smallness). This allows Plato to account for what we would call symmetric and asymmetric relations respectively. Plato does not set out these distinctions explicitly or track them in his language but shows awareness of needing such distinctions on the basis of problems raised in dialogues such as the Hippias Major and the Phaedo. His solution also allows him to account for relations in a unique way, without reifying them, and thus avoiding serious philosophical problems that relations realists (including many contemporary metaphysicians) face. In the Sophist, Plato develops yet another type of participation, “permeation,” along with a new category of second-order Forms, the Great Kinds. These second-order Forms permeate first-order Forms and set up patterns of participation. These patterns in turn provide structure and distinguish necessary from contingent forms of participation. Yet Plato soon realizes these second-order structures have become too complex and introduce their own regress worries (worries that Plato does not explicitly express, but that Marmodoro suggests Plato would have reasonably been aware of). He soon drops the idea of second-order Forms and develops a new account of structure and necessity in the Timaeus.

Plato’s new, though unfinished, metaphysical developments of the Timaeus are the focus of the last chapter. Plato finally gives up the idea of constitutional overlap, positing imitation as his new mechanism for property qualification in what Marmodoro calls “qualitative overlap.” Marmodoro explains that, while the idea of imitation appears in earlier dialogues, it is not until the Timaeus that it becomes Plato’s preferred mechanism. Marmodoro does not consider it an improvement but argues that it allows for a new account of structure and a solution to the Third Man Argument. The paradeigma of the Timaeus solves the Third Man Argument because it is entirely free of becoming. Marmodoro conceives of the paradeigma as the totality of Forms and their structure, simplifying what was an overly complex network of second-order Forms in the Sophist. The Demiurge then imitates the Forms of the paradeigma in creating sensible objects that resemble them, thereby individuating the Forms as well. The Demiurge also serves as an efficient cause as does Anaxagoras’ nous. Plato’s final account of structure is similar to Anaxagoras’ as well: some structure is explained by the triangles, the most basic building blocks of physical reality, and the rest by the Demiurge imitating the paradeigma, just as Anaxagoras explains some structure by means of his seeds and the rest by the activity of nous.

As I hope is abundantly clear by this point, there is much in this book that will be of interest for historians of philosophy and contemporary metaphysicians alike. Individual chapters are comprehensible on their own: Marmodoro repeats important passages and cites where important claims have been defended previously in the book. Just beware that internal footnote and page number references appear to have suffered some systematic misalignment (chapter and section numbers are usually given and will be a more reliable guide here). This complex and compressed account is not suited for students or other beginners; that being said, Marmodoro’s comparisons between Plato and Anaxagoras’ metaphysics are apt, informative, and are here made accessible for the diverse range of scholars that may take an interest in them. I am confident that the book will succeed in fulfilling Marmodoro’s aim of inspiring others, as she puts it, to “[delve] further into Plato’s wonderfully rich metaphysical system” (206).


Marmodoro, A. (2017) Everything in Everything: Anaxagoras's Metaphysics. New York: Oxford University Press.

Moore, C. (2019) Calling Philosophers Names: On the Origin of a Discipline. Princeton: Princeton University Press