Forms of Life and Language Games

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Jesús Padilla Gálvez and Margit Gaffal (eds.), Forms of Life and Language Games, Ontos, 2011, 208pp., $107.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381221

Reviewed by Oskari Kuusela, University of East Anglia


This book collects together articles relating to the later Wittgenstein's notions of language-game and form of life, originally presented in a conference on the same topic. Despite the specificity of this theme, the topics of the individual articles show considerable variation. They range from a critique of truth-conditional semantics to the interpretation of Wittgenstein's critical views on the faith of contemporary culture in science and progress, and from discussions of the uses of the notion of form of life in nineteenth- and twentieth-century biology and cultural studies to Friedrich Hayek on rules, Wittgenstein's aesthetics, the development of his thought, and influences on him. Although most chapters have exegetical aims or seek to clarify conceptual history as background for exegesis, others have different goals. What follows is a discussion of each chapter in turn.

Chapter 1 by P.M.S. Hacker, 'Language, language-games and forms of life', is a restatement of Hacker's interpretation of Wittgenstein on meaning, presented as a critique of truth-conditional semantics. Although this chapter is certainly more lucid than some others and makes a number of very interesting points about meaning and theories thereof, it bears certain problematic characteristics of Hacker's writings on Wittgenstein. Just like any other defender of philosophical theories, views are attributed to Wittgenstein about the nature of meaning and its possibility that exclude any competing views. The possibility that Wittgenstein's methodology might make possible a more nuanced approach isn't considered. A case in point is the possibility that truth-functional semantics might be seen as capturing a particular aspect of linguistic meaning, even if it wouldn't be the whole story about meaning, in which case it wouldn't be automatically excluded by the alternative accounts of meaning Wittgenstein develops. Hacker has been blamed for dogmatism in relevant connections, and this chapter does little to dispel such worries. In particular, his response that statements of grammatical rules generally aren't any more dogmatic than the characterization of bachelors as unmarried men doesn't convince (p. 35). The criticism was always that the danger of dogmatism exists in cases where the concepts are complex and claims are made about what all instances falling under them must be. To present a simple concept as exemplifying the absence of the problem doesn't address the charge.

Chapter 2 by Jesús Padilla Gálvez, 'Language as forms of life', argues that Wittgenstein's term 'Lebensform', its plural 'Lebensformen', and 'Form des Lebens', are used in distinct meanings by Wittgenstein, and seeks to provide an overview of some discussions on Wittgenstein's notion of form of life. I failed to be enlightened on both counts. The argument about the distinct senses of Wittgenstein's terms suffers from the questionable method of so-called passage hunting, whereby suitable sounding remarks from Wittgenstein are quoted to support a relevant claim without any consideration of their context and its implications for interpretation. As in the present instance, the results tend to be unconvincing. The author's discussion of debates on the notion of form of life, i.e., whether this notion should be understood monistically or pluralistically, and whether there could be conflicts between forms of life, struck me as presupposing the acceptance of problematic philosophical assumptions. Most relevantly, Wittgenstein's notion of a form of life is here understood theoretically, as intended to provide us with an account of the foundation for language. Such a foundationalist reading has indeed been assumed in debates between authors such as Newton Garver and Rudolf Haller. But the readings also lead Wittgenstein into a conflict with his rejection of philosophical theories. So, by contrast, what about the interpretational possibility, for example, that forms of life, i.e., actions and life intertwined with language use, are to be treated as given in the capacity of objects of examination? In this capacity they would be what Wittgenstein urges us to turn our attention to if we want to get clear about our conceptual problems, but they would not be a foundation that fixes our concepts and what we should say about them in philosophy. Such possibilities, important for contemporary debates, aren't considered at all.

Chapter 3 by Margit Gaffal, 'Forms of life as social techniques', examines the uses of the term 'form of life' (or 'Lebensform') in the beginning of the twentieth century. As the author observes, in Wittgenstein-interpretation a Spenglerian interpretation of the term has mostly been adopted without much consideration of others, such as Hermann Amman, Alfred Adler or Alfred Wechsler, who also used it. The chapter's focus is specifically on Wechsler and possible analogies with Wittgenstein. To some extent, I found the chapter problematic on the same grounds as the preceding one. It assumes Wittgenstein to be using the notion of form of life foundationalistically. Here too the author seeks to support the interpretation by means of passage hunting, employing partly the same problematic remarks as her co-editor. In the end the analogy between Wechsler and Wittgenstein isn't properly developed either; how it should be understood is left largely implicit. This is particularly striking in the conclusion, where the author entirely forgets Wittgenstein and only speaks about Wechsler.

Chapter 4 by Norberto Abreu e Silva Neto, 'The uses of "forms of life" and the meanings of life', is a mostly philological discussion of uses of the notion of form of life in German and British biology from the eighteenth century onwards, with references also to Goethe and Kant, Schleiermacher, Humbolt, Huizinga and Hegel. I found this chapter more helpful than the previous one with respect to the aim of providing historical background for the interpretation of Wittgenstein's uses of the term. The author takes up, but doesn't really develop, an idea of the notion of a form of life as a methodological tool of Goethean comparative morphology (pp. 93-94). This is interesting because Wittgenstein explicitly compares his method of conceptual investigation with Goethe's, although the author doesn't discuss relevant remarks (see, Wittgenstein 1998, §§949-950). Apparently the author isn't aware of any conflicts between the notion thus understood and its foundationalist interpretation either, which he shares with the authors of chapters 2 and 3. The two lines of interpretation are run together without discussion of any potential problems.

Chapter 5 by Cecilia B. Beristain, 'Language games and the latticed discourses of myself', discusses the problem of the I or the self from a Wittgenstenian point of view. From this angle the problem takes the form of the question 'how do I talk about myself?', rather than a search for some entity we could call the 'self' or the 'I'. A problem I had with this chapter was that it didn't really add anything new to discussions on the topic, rehearsing basic points about Wittgenstein's view. The author's employment of the notion of privacy also seemed careless, for example, when she states that 'it is disputed by Wittgenstein that we have any privacy in regard to our own feelings, thoughts, etc.' (p. 113; cf. p. 115). What happened to the distinction between private in principle and contingently private?

Chapter 6 by Pierluigi Biancini, 'From Umgebung to form of life: A genealogical reading', offers a scholarly examination of the notions of Umgebung, practice of language (Praxis der Sprache), and form of life in Wittgenstein's writings from the mid-1930s to the Philosophical Investigations. I agree with the author that 'one of the greatest difficulties in talking about "form of life" is due to the philosophical desire to talk of it as unitary, like a well-defined and self-contained idea that from the beginning to end is always used without change.' (p. 121) But on that basis I would also hesitate to claim with the author that the term is meant to perform the unitary function of solving a sceptical problem about the world/language relation (p. 122). (Still, it might partly be meant to contribute to that too.) Overall, this chapter, like several others, seemed less clear than desirable about Wittgenstein's non-theoretical commitments. For example, the author characterizes language-games as 'methodologically objects of comparison', and yet also thinks that they must assume the notion of a form of life as a background and general framework, which seems to involve treating 'language-game' and 'form of life' as theoretical terms (p. 135). The notion of a form of life is also said to give us an account of the constitution of the world through language (p. 138). If that isn't a philosophical/metaphysical theory, I don't know what is. Although I did find this chapter interesting, again it seemed to mix Wittgenstein's explicitly non-metaphysical methodological ideas with metaphysical theorizing about language in a way detrimental to clarity.

Chapter 7 by António Marques, 'The so-called "new direction" of the late Wittgenstein', is a discussion of the development of Wittgenstein's thought after the completion of Philosophical Investigations, with special reference to the book's so-called part II or MS 144, its manuscript version. I had similar issues as with some other chapters. On the one hand, the author declares Wittgenstein's later method to be therapeutic. Only the scantest and quite controversial textual evidence is given to justify this claim, and although the controversiality of the interpretation is noted in passing, it is not discussed. On the other hand, Wittgenstein's therapy is characterized as, basically, a new way of doing metaphysics whose aim is 'to grasp the essence of certain metaphysical terms [by] bringing them to their everyday use.' (p. 145) I don't see how these two interpretational ideas can be made consistent. Moreover, although I would agree that Wittgenstein's thought probably never found a resting place, as he continued to challenge himself to new thoughts, it doesn't seem sufficient to characterize his new directions as simply a matter of focus on psychological concepts, as the author does. That only counts as a switch of topic, not a new direction. Furthermore, the author may be right that Wittgenstein's way of proceeding involves the emphasis of different aspects of a matter in such a way that an overall balance is eventually found that isn't present in each separate part of the discussion. But why such balancing acts should be seen as a matter of new directions of thought, rather than part of Wittgenstein's method, and why they should be explained by way of developmental hypotheses remains unclear.

By contrast to some others, Chapter 8 by Vicente Sanfélix Vidarte, 'Wittgenstein and the criticism of technological and scientific civilization', is a nuanced and thought-provoking discussion of Wittgenstein's views on science and progress, including the atomic bomb. According to the author, Wittgenstein's basic point is to combat unfounded certainties relating to the idea of progress through science that is characteristic of the age of science, and to make us conscious of the irrational nature of this faith. Couldn't it be that science eventually turns out to be, despite the great things it has done for humanity, a trap? If science is guided by the idea of progress, where exactly is it leading us, given that the notion of progress as such doesn't determine any specific goals? Whatever the answers may be, this chapter interprets Wittgenstein's difficult remarks on the topic to an illuminating effect.

Chapter 9 by Michel Le Du, 'Wittgenstein and Hayek on rules and lines of conduct', discusses the notion of a rule as understood by Friedrich Hayek in comparison with Wittgenstein's conception of rules, revealing problems with Hayek's account. Overall, the emphasis is here on Hayek, not Wittgenstein. And although such an examination might be of interest to those concerned with Hayek's thought, to me the purpose of this chapter remained unclear. No attempt is made to explain in what way a critical examination of Hayek in the light of Wittgenstein should be of interest. For example, nothing is said about the consequences such a criticism has for Hayek's thought overall, or whether there are any.

Chapter 10 by Nuno Venturinha, 'Wittgenstein's debt to Straffa', seeks to 'add a new piece to the puzzle' of Straffa's influence on Wittgenstein (p. 188). For, while Wittgenstein saw the influence as highly significant, even decisive, interpreters have been at pains to say why. I confess that again I failed to be enlightened and found myself asking afterwards how the discussion was meant to add a piece to the puzzle. The author presents us with, but doesn't examine in detail, an extremely interesting quote of Straffa's comments on the Blue Book (p. 189). Basically, the quote seems to put pressure on the rather programmatic way in which Wittgenstein presents his ideas about philosophy there (as well as later in the Brown Book), raising questions about the kind of justification they are meant to have. Is Wittgenstein, for example, making a factual claim about the genesis of philosophical problems through linguistic confusions? What is striking is how these criticisms seem to be taken into account in the Philosophical Investigations almost point by point, as exemplified by its methodologically important idea of demonstrating a method by examples that is absent from the Blue Book. Would this not constitute an important form of possible influence? Apparently, not according to the author, who doesn't consider such matters at all.

Finally, Chapter 11 by Jakub Mácha, 'Art as institution and expression', seeks to employ the notions of form of life and language-game to elucidate Wittgenstein's aesthetics. I didn't find this attempt successful, partly due to what seemed to me confusions about the notion of language-games and their role as instruments of clarification in Wittgenstein's philosophy. Once again an essentially theoretical, as opposed to methodological, interpretation of the notions of form of life and language-game dominated the discussion. For me the strangest suggestion in this paper (even if marginal to the main argument) was that we need to assume a Tractarian notion of isomorphism of form as the theoretical underpinning of the employment of invented language-games as models of actual language use. I can't get my head around why anyone would think that.

Probably my preceding comments already make clear my evaluation of the book overall. I don't consider it a particularly valuable contribution, with one or two chapters as exceptions. The editorial work on the book is poor. In addition to  issues such as apparently unchecked English and some authors referring to their chapters as papers or talks, there is no index or list of contributors. Given that most of the authors aren't well-known in the Anglophone philosophical world, the latter would have been helpful. Bibliographies lack unified formatting, and abbreviations to Wittgenstein's works are given only in some chapters, leaving some references unidentified even to a specialist. Chapter titles are sometimes spelled with the first letters capitalized and sometimes not, and the list of contents gives a wrong title for chapter 7. But the worst is that the editors and authors appear to have not communicated much about the contents of the chapters. There would have been obvious ways to improve the chapters, such as urging authors to say explicitly what they promised to talk about, rather than leaving their conclusions implicit. From the fact that the conference was held in the same year that the book appeared, I imagine that haste is perhaps partly to blame. That is a pity. The book would have benefited from a little more work.


Wittgenstein, Ludwig, Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology, Vol. I. Oxford: Blackwell, 1998.