Foucault and Classical Antiquity: Power, Ethics and Knowledge

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Wolfgang Detel, Foucault and Classical Antiquity: Power, Ethics and Knowledge, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 292pp, $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521833817. Translated by David Wigg-Wolf.

Reviewed by Brad Inwood, University of Toronto


This is an able translation of Detel's Macht, Moral, Wissen: Foucault und die Klassische Antike (Suhrkamp 1998) for Cambridge University Press's series 'Modern European Philosophy', and it is a welcome addition to a strong list. Detel is best known as a scholar of ancient philosophy who has made a substantial contribution to the study of Plato and Aristotle as well as to other fields within the subject. His publications in other areas of the history of philosophy are less well known to me, and include work on Gassendi and Hobbes as well as on twentieth-century philosophers as diverse as Davidson and Foucault. This wide range of publications (see helps to explain the depth and richness of the current work, a book which will engage not only Foucault scholars but also philosophers interested in Plato and Aristotle as well as in non-historical fields such as semantics, social ontology and critical theory.

In the present work this range of interests comes together in a manner which should strike its intended readership as innovative and challenging, since it combines in a single study themes and lines of argument not usually found together. Chapter 1 (Morals, knowledge and power) focuses on a critical examination and extension of Foucault's conceptions of power and knowledge; volume 1 of the History of Sexuality (The Will to Know) plays a bigger role in the analysis than any specifically ancient theme or problem. In chapter 2 (The ethical teleology) select ancient themes, especially from Aristotle's ethics, do come into focus and The Use of Pleasure (volume 2 of the History) bulks large. Here we find an acute analysis of the limitations and strengths of Foucault's approach to the analysis of social and sexual relations in classical Greece as represented by the works of Plato, Aristotle and Xenophon. The engagement with social thought and ways of life in the ancient world continues in chapter 3 (The scientific regimen) with a similarly critical study of Foucault's approach to regimen, especially in the large corpus of medical texts, and in chapter 4 (The asymmetrical relationship) with an extended analysis of the social dynamics of the relationship between husband and wife and between paiderastēs and the object of his affections. Chapter 5 (The epistemic eros), by contrast, is devoted predominantly to a fresh analysis of the interplay between eros and epistemology in the work of Plato, especially in the Symposium; it perhaps offers less to readers whose interest is primarily in Foucault and more to the student of Platonism (especially those with some sympathy for broadly unitarian approaches). The final chapter (Gender, nature and reference) will be the greatest interest to students of critical theory, post-modernism, semantics and social ontology. Although Foucault is relevant to all these fields and is critiqued at some length, it is fair to say that the chapter is not really about Foucault as such (focusing as it does on the concepts of gender and sex, arguing for the viability of a minimalist conception of sex and the limited utility of the concept of gender in studying the history of culture) and contributes less directly to the understanding of his approach to antiquity.

The book does not end with a concluding discussion showing how these sometimes divergent themes come together, but that is no flaw. As the short, lucid introduction makes clear, the underlying unity of this sequence of critical studies lies in its concrete demonstration both of what is successful and creative in Foucault's philosophical project and of the frequent, almost systematic limitations which appear in its application to the study of the ancient world. The book is intended as "an example of a rational approach to post-modern thought, that takes its intuitions seriously, but without renouncing exact explication and critical examination according to the usual standards of philosophy and science" (5). The importance of the final chapter, so loosely connected to the analysis of the ancient world, lies in its argument that rationality and semantic stability are defensible even in the context of post-modern critical theory. If successful, this argument would enable philosophers to take on board the central intuition that language and reason are indeed structured by Foucauldian regulative power without thereby abandoning hope that there is a rational and evidence-based standpoint from which to judge and refine even such critical theories.

There are at least two distinct audiences for this clear, crisply argued and largely convincing book: first, those like the present reviewer whose primary interest is in the way Foucault represents and sometimes misrepresents ancient societies and their philosophical achievements; second, those who care most about Foucault's effort to transform the way we think about the relationship between knowledge, social relations and the history of culture. Both audiences will be stretched by Detel's argument. Repeatedly Detel demonstrates Foucault's misunderstandings of key aspects of ancient culture and philosophy, but to appreciate fully his argument one has to be ready for close analysis of seldom read texts of Xenophon and the Hippocratic corpus as well as technical criticism of central texts of Plato and Aristotle. It won't suffice to take Foucauldian descriptions of ancient culture at more or less face value and then debate the philosophical consequences. Historians of the ancient world and ancient philosophy in their turn cannot smugly dismiss the deep challenge to their way of practicing their craft posed by Foucault just because he gets a good deal of the history wrong; they will have to grapple with Detel's powerful analysis of Foucault's conception of power in chapter 1 (which highlights Foucault's view that power is not fundamentally repressive but in its basic form is 'positive', as Detel puts it on p.28) and his application of Davidsonian semantics to the problem of establishing how it is that we can know that we are sometimes talking about the same things as the ancients were. Neither group will find the book an easy read, but they will not feel that they have been talked down to either.

On Detel's interpretation, Foucault got many things wrong about the ancient world not just because he was somewhat detached from the sharpest historical scholarship of his day and not because his general approach was deeply flawed. Over and over again Detel demonstrates that Foucault, as it were, lets his own method down, that a revised or more carefully applied version of his approach would have yielded better results. Detel seems to think that Foucault might have seen the variety of ancient thought about knowledge more clearly if he had found more room for non-repressive regulative power in his analyses. Detel's analysis of Foucault's use of Aristotelian ethics is particularly subtle. Foucault went wrong, it seems, by underestimating Aristotle's commitment to the notion of objective ethical and political norms (which does not, of course, diminish the importance of his appreciation for the subjective standpoint in the practice of moral improvement) and by misconstruing enkrateia within Aristotle's system.

Seen from the perspective of Aristotle's texts, Foucault underestimates the central concept of ethical work and assigns it an incorrect systematic role. This is because he does not locate ethical work in the telos of a good life, but in the deficient state of enkrateia, and thus improperly generalises the model of domination and restriction. This in turn reveals another question that Foucault cannot even formulate within the concept of his interpretation -- that is the question of what specific form Aristotle thinks that the ethical work that leads from enkrateia to sōphrosunē, from self-control to virtue, has. (p. 64)

Foucault's appreciation of regimens of health (or dietetics) in ancient medicine and moral philosophy is limited in part because he overestimated the significance of sexual regimen (in contrast to the more general issue of regulating excess and imbalance) for ancient medical writers. Oddly, he underestimated the social and economic functions of sexual self-control and slights Plato's fundamental interests in epistemology and ontology by selective focus on only certain aspects of eros. But Detel's closely argued and sensitive analysis of what goes wrong in each of these cases makes it clear how much historians have to gain from at least some of Foucault's critical insights and how much critical theorists could benefit from deeper and wider historical knowledge -- of the sort which Detel argues in his final chapter can be attained despite the difficulties we face in fixing the reference of our objects of study when we approach historically or conceptually remote cultures.

Detailed comment on Detel's analysis of Foucault is beyond my competence, but his historical analysis of ancient society and ancient philosophy is almost uniformly detailed and convincing. I take issue with his overly generous reconstruction of early Pythagoreanism in chapter 5 (Burkert's Weisheit und Wissenschaft seems not to have made an appropriately firm impression on Detel), but other points of contention (such as Detel's unitarian inclinations and his assumptions about the dating of dialogues) are issues on which specialists continue to disagree with no sign of orthodoxy emerging.

There is one regrettable limitation in the book's plan. Foucault's use and appropriation of later ancient philosophy has in some ways been even more influential than his treatment of classical Greek thought and culture. Hence Detel's lack of interest in Foucault on the philosophy of the Hellenistic and Roman periods, especially Stoicism, is disappointing. In this respect Foucault and Classical Antiquity leaves a gap which another recent book helps to fill. The collection of papers edited by Frédéric Gros and Carlos Lévy on Foucault et la philosophie antique covers some of this ground (Éditions Kimé, Paris, 2003) and should be read in combination with Detel's more powerful, more unified and philosophically systematic treatment. One further contrast between these two works should also be noted. The French collection emerged from a conference held to celebrate the publication of L'herméneutique du sujet in 2001 and is focused primarily on that critically important collection of Collège de France lectures, while Detel's book was first published in German in 1998, the fruit of what had apparently already been a long study of Foucault's published works. That this should make so much difference to the object of the two works says something quite important about the role of publication as opposed to just talking in Foucault's intellectual life and work and in the reception of it by various philosophical communities.

The translation by David Wigg-Wolf is throughout clear and easy to read, an accomplishment not to be taken for granted when German philosophy is translated into contemporary English. I noted only a handful of superficially awkward or puzzling turns of phrase and these will not cause the alert reader any trouble. Similarly, the book is well produced with few editorial or typographical errors. Cambridge University Press has done a real service to the large and regrettably growing audience which is interested in contemporary German philosophical scholarship but cannot easily read it in German. Linguistically as well as philosophically, this English edition of Detel's book ought to be a bridge between various intellectual communities whose shared interests are often insufficient to bring them together in fruitful dialogue.