Foucault and Nietzsche: A Critical Encounter

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Alan Rosenberg and Joseph Westfall (eds.), Foucault and Nietzsche: A Critical Encounter, Bloomsbury, 2018, 238pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781474247399.

Reviewed by Tuomo Tiisala, New York University


It is quite astonishing that the first anthology in English devoted to the relationship between Foucault and Nietzsche appears in 2018. It's well known that Nietzsche plays a special role in Foucault's thought, but instead of a lively scholarly interest in the relationship between the two philosophers one has become accustomed to the somewhat mythical account that reading Nietzsche, on a beach under the Italian sun in 1953, liberated Foucault from the influence of the three Hs -- Hegel, Husserl, Heidegger -- that dominated French philosophy at the time.[1] Thanks to recent additions to the Bibliothèque National de France, a more nuanced account of this shift is undoubtedly already underway. Similarly, one approaches the collection Alan Rosenberg and Joseph Westfall have edited with the expectation of finding Foucault's lifelong encounter with Nietzsche finally fleshed out with philosophical substance. This perspective is vitally important to balance a recent line of excellent scholarship focusing on the Kantian roots of Foucault's work. Even if Kantian themes such as the limits of knowledge, freedom as autonomy, and the Enlightenment envelop Foucault's oeuvre, it is the Nietzschean topics -- disunity of the subject, power, historical discontinuity, experimentation -- that define Foucault's particular philosophical orientation. Understanding Foucault requires thinking (parts of) Kant and Nietzsche together. But, as the essays reveal, coming to grips with Foucault's relationship with Nietzsche is a challenging task in its own right.

Let me begin from the epistemological questions that also enjoy a priority in Foucault's reading and adoption of Nietzsche. "Will to Know," Foucault's title for the first volume of History of Sexuality, which has been erased from the English translation, constitutes Foucault's greatest and most conspicuous tribute to Nietzsche. It makes explicit the epistemological debt one can trace to Foucault's discussions in "Nietzsche, Genealogy, History", Lectures on the Will to Know, "A Lecture on Nietzsche", and "Truth and Juridical Forms," all dating from around 1970. Reading Nietzsche enabled Foucault to conceptualize epistemic relations as constitutively dependent on social relations, while refusing to explain the historical evolution of systems of thought in terms of teleological development or ideological determination. In Foucault's words, the Nietzschean approach opened up for him the perspective of "an external, exterior history of truth," in which neither the knowing subject nor the objects of knowledge are given independently of historically specific tactics and strategies that organize a swath of social practices.[2] This perspective does not arise from within Foucault's project of an archaeology of knowledge, as Paul Patton suggests in his essay, but rather signals its genealogical extension. With an external history of truth Foucault's focus of attention shifts from the implicit conceptual form of a given system of thought to its historical formation through heterogenous events in the field of social practices.

Though Foucault adopts this perspective for his genealogical investigations, he explicitly acknowledges "an internal history of truth," that is, "the history of truth that rectifies itself in terms of its own principles of regulation," as a valid alternative.[3] Behind the most simplistic yet by no means rare dismissals of Foucault's epistemological work, lies a failure to acknowledge his appreciation of this multiplicity of perspectives that correspond to distinct, mutually supplementary, lines of inquiry. It is therefore unfortunate that this important topic is neglected in the essays that focus on Foucault's project of a history of truth. Moreover, the essays leave it somewhat unclear why Nietzsche should have played such a crucial role in this area of Foucault's philosophical development. Alan D. Schrift aims to show that Nietzsche's account of knowledge enabled Foucault (1) to conceptualize signs and interpretation without reliance on phenomenology, structuralism or a metaphysically self-standing subject, (2) to combine a system of signs and relations of power in one analysis, and (3) to develop a historical analysis of knowledge that avoids taking the subject-object relation for granted. What is missing from Schrift's generally plausible account, however, is an explanation of the philosophical obstacle Nietzsche allegedly helped Foucault overcome. Without a reconstruction of the French philosophical context, the obstacle, as well as Nietzsche's special role, remain elusive. After all, Hegel and Marx had already repudiated the notion of a metaphysically self-standing subject, and Heidegger had offered an essentially social account of meaning in terms of practices, so why exactly did certain conceptual possibilities appear unavailable to Foucault prior to his reading of Nietzsche?

Even if one correctly identifies the perspective of Foucault's history of truth, justified confusion may arise due to the distinction he makes between "the will to know" and "the will to truth". Patton successfully clarifies some of the perplexity this terminology invites. Since truth is criterial for knowledge, Foucault's discussion appears hopelessly confused, especially because his main thesis is that the will to know became a will to truth in Plato and Aristotle, and that one should follow Nietzsche in cancelling this implication from knowledge to truth. So does Foucault hold that there is knowledge that is not true? No, because Foucault's topic, behind the obfuscating terminology, is not the logical dependence between knowledge and truth but the historical development of two competing conceptions of truth. As Patton shows, Foucault assigns the decisive role to Nietzsche due to his attacks on the metaphysical conception of truth as a self-standing object that is naturally available to the subject, especially in "On Truth and Lie in a Nonmoral Sense" and in The Gay Science. Thus, "the will to know" becomes "the will to truth" when one adopts a conception of truth as an object of knowledge that is independent of human practices, including the linguistically developed conceptual resources that enable the formation of truth-claims in the first place. Though Patton's analysis is convincing, it would benefit from explicitly disentangling the metaphysical, epistemic, logical, and historical aspects that so often muddle a discussion of Foucault or Nietzsche on truth. Furthermore, the internal evolution of Nietzsche's and Foucault's respective reflections on the topic calls for more attention. Through a period in the early 1970s Foucault rather uncritically reiterates Nietzsche's early claim that language, and conceptualization in general, always does violence to things and therefore truth is an illusion. But just as Nietzsche concludes in Twilight of the Idols that the very distinction between the true world and appearance is undermined as a consequence of the repudiation of the metaphysical conception of truth, so does Foucault cease referring to truth except as the property of successful truth-claims whose truth or falsity is determined according to the rules of a discursive practice.[4] Nietzsche's Wahr-sagen becomes Foucault's véridiction, the activity whose changing conditions an external history of truth tries to account for in terms of a genealogical analysis of social practices.

Avoiding unviable caricatures in epistemology is all the more important since both Foucault and Nietzsche evidently rely on a notion of truth in connection with the central task of self-overcoming they promote. Thus, Keith Ansell-Pearson argues that both Nietzsche and Foucault acknowledge that "a passion for knowledge" is a prerequisite for the kind of experimental relation to oneself which they endorse. For Nietzsche, it is this passion that yields joyous knowledge (fröhliche Wissenschaft) by way of refuting metaphysical and moral prejudices about the nature of human agency, crucially the notion that an agent is unified by a will that exerts itself as an uncaused cause. Ansell-Pearson convincingly argues that only after this shift can one begin to relate to oneself as a composite of drives that make up the material for the task of active self-constitution Nietzsche praises so highly. Experimentation with the self has its epistemic prerequisites and they are unintelligible without a notion of truth. But an important disanalogy escapes Ansell-Pearson when he tries to locate this passion for knowledge within Foucault's work. As he puts it, for Foucault, "the critical task is to break with accustomed habits of knowing and perceiving, so that one has the chance to become something different than what one's history has conditioned one to be, to think and perceive differently." (80) For instance, Foucault's interrogation of sexuality seeks to enable a conceptual space with an enlarged scope of possibility for experimentation with pleasure by way of repudiating the very questions of sexual identity that strike us as obviously indispensable in the present. But notice how the goal of the passion for knowledge has shifted. Foucault's aim is not to refute moral or metaphysical prejudice but to disclose new conceptual possibilities. In fact, this divergence runs deep and calls for an extensive study.

The discussion of the passion for knowledge shows that Nietzsche by no means denies the value of truth but makes it subservient to the task of active self-constitution. Alan Milchman and Alan Rosenberg helpfully bring into relief the art of living as the general background for this perspective. But what is the task of philosophy, and the role of a philosopher in particular, in connection with the art of living? Both Nietzsche and Foucault see themselves as diagnosticians of a historical present, but Michael Ure and Federico Testa argue that this common approach leads to two sharply divergent projects. Nietzsche's "Dionysian" diagnoses are in the service of life, a value affirmed by free spirits, whereas Foucault's philosophical interventions inaugurate, according to Ure and Testa, a task of "Sisyphian" pointlessness and endless repetition. The problem with this reading is that Ure and Testa fail to grasp how Foucault's view of critique as a diagnostic activity receives its motivation from the ideal of autonomy, understood as self-determination. In addition, they overlook Foucault's reasons for holding that exercises of autonomy are always embedded in some constellation of power relations that limit the scope of possibility one is able to entertain as an agent. The second part of the contrast Ure and Testa build between Foucault and Nietzsche concerns the role of modality in the art of living. On their reading, Nietzsche proposes the eternal recurrence as a thought experiment that enables one to affirm one's particular life trajectory in the guise of necessity. And they contrast this reliance on necessity with Foucault's quest to unmask and thus destabilize apparent necessities as contingent. But just as Foucault never says that nothing is necessary, universal or obligatory, Nietzsche's thought experiment with necessity presupposes that one already sees one's life as a constellation of forces whose organization is largely contingent. Rather than necessity per se Nietzsche's guiding concern is how one's beliefs about necessity and possibility affect one's agency, including whether agency requires that the agent harbor certain kinds of false modal beliefs.

Jill E. Hargis raises in outline the important question of whether the focus on self-transformation makes Foucault and Nietzsche unable to diagnose some of the most entrenched configurations of power relations that have congealed under liberalism precisely in terms of a certain conception of individuality. The topic of necessity resurfaces when Brian Lightbody contrasts Foucault's and Nietzsche's accounts of genealogy on the basis of their divergent attitudes towards the body. Whereas Foucault describes the human body as a paradigmatic object of genealogical deconstruction, Lightbody emphasizes that Nietzsche has a tendency to view the agent's physiological constitution as a source of constraints which vary from one type of person to another. The contrast is striking between Nietzsche's methodological reliance on a physiological-cum-psychological typology, on the one hand, and Foucault's repeated insistence on the body's historical malleability, on the other. But Lightbody cites no textual evidence to support his claim that Foucault criticizes -- or even discusses -- this dimension of Nietzsche's philosophy. On the contrary, Foucault presents the body's historical malleability as a Nietzschean example of the genealogical drive to discover contingency in the most unexpected of places. One reason for this may be that the body, in fact, never appears as a fixed object for Nietzsche, who sees it instead as a composite of drives. And yet it is on the level of the composition and organization of drives, from one individual to another, that Nietzsche's explanatory strategy as a psychologist commits him to a relatively fixed typology. Lightbody does not explain why Foucault overlooks this central tenet of Nietzsche's philosophical method but I will briefly revisit the topic in my conclusion.

In fact, psychological explanations enter into Foucault analytics of power only in connection with discussions of pleasure. For instance, Foucault argues in the first volume of History of Sexuality that the strategic organization of the modern apparatus of sexuality relies on tactical support from mechanisms of incitation and excitement that give rise to "perpetual spirals of power and pleasure" in the discursive articulation of sexuality through medicalized techniques of confession.[5] Foucault is thus arguing against the conceptual assumption that relations of power necessarily distort knowledge and constrain pleasure. Jim Urpeth tries to show that "the essentially libidinally affectively invested character of power" (192), which he attributes to Foucault on the basis of the above remarks, undermines any interpretation and criticism of Christianity and its moral offspring as repressive. Also Nietzsche's account of the ascetic priest in On the Genealogy of Morality reveals, according to Urpeth, this character of power. But Urpeth's reading lumps together "the libidinal-affective dimension" (186), whereas Nietzsche is exceptionally subtle and discerning when it comes to attributions of affect. Resentment, on the one hand, and pleasure in cruelty, on the other, are historical building blocks of morality, according to Nietzsche. But Nietzsche's Genealogy offers no textual support to Urpeth's sweeping libidinization of affect. In Nietzsche's account, the self-abnegation of the ascetic priest is driven by the unconscious feeling of resentment, a drive in the service of degenerating life. Nor does Foucault hold, as Urpeth reads him, that relations of power are essentially invested with sexual pleasure. Foucault's History of Sexuality traces how networks of dependence emerged and developed between relations of power, bodies of pleasures, and discursive practices around sexual conduct, but the links between power and pleasure do not generalize in the way Urpeth suggests. And whereas Nietzsche does attack Christian morality for its repressive structure, Foucault's approach proceeds as a more fine-grained diagnosis in the service of rethinking how one constitutes oneself as a moral subject of sexual desire in the present. Thus, Foucault studies the practices of governing the self and others that developed under the auspices of the Christian pastorate in order to show how and when sexual relations became unthinkable without a hermeneutics of desire and obedience to an external moral authority, two central features that continue to structure the modern experience of sexuality as an object of psychiatric expertise.

João Constâncio and Marta Faustino respond to Axel Honneth's criticism that the conception of power which Foucault and Nietzsche allegedly share precludes social relations based on reciprocal recognition and therefore must be rejected. They offer a lucid and largely plausible interpretation of Nietzsche and Foucault that locates recognition, in one sense, at the heart of their respective accounts of social relations. However, as Constâncio and Faustino acknowledge, what is at stake for Honneth is reciprocal recognition whose symmetrical structure is supposed to lay the foundation for just social relations. This of course is a question neither Nietzsche nor Foucault are studying at all, so showing that their discussions of struggle include an agonistic conception of recognition, as Constâncio and Faustino do, is ultimately tangential to Honneth's concerns. Recognition, in the agonistic sense, requires little because it is achieved, for instance, by a psychiatrist who treats her patient as a pervert. This is obviously far removed from the structure of reciprocity and, relatedly, claims to equality that Honneth seeks to establish. Thus, this discrepancy of concerns suggests that the relationship between Hegelian and Nietzschean approaches to social reality, the question Constâncio and Faustino wish to broach for future study, is likely much harder to deal with than they anticipate.

Overall, the anthology helps effectively dispel the notion that Foucault might be, as he once famously said, "simply Nietzschean".[6] Sometimes the caveats and complications, in fact, take the form of a straightforward rejection, Foucault being, as he quickly adds in the same context, very much "anti-Nietzschean".[7] Unfortunately these important points of divergence receive little attention in this volume. One is Nietzsche's reliance on psychological methodology. After all, Foucault proclaims that the art of living, and the critical philosophical practice sustaining it, aim to "kill psychology".[8] But little of philosophical substance in Nietzsche's work would survive a depsychologization à la Foucault. For Foucault, this task is motivated by his diagnosis that a taxonomy of human kinds created by human sciences constrains our autonomy as individual thinkers and agents. Yet Nietzsche is a paradigmatic example of a philosopher whose thinking operates thoroughly on the basis of such a taxonomy of psychological types.

Another point of divergence that merits more attention concerns the values Nietzsche and Foucault, seek to promote by means of their philosophical interventions. While autonomy, formally understood, is a guiding value Foucault and Nietzsche share, Foucault's political engagement and considered insistence on the rights of the governed, detached from the metaphysics of human nature, are always deployed in allegiance with marginalized perspectives of the mad, the sick, the weak, and the suffering.[9] As Nietzsche is the first to point out, his concerns lay elsewhere. Rather surprisingly the topic of nihilism receives no discussion either, notwithstanding Foucault's provocative statement in his last lecture course at the Collège de France, echoing Nietzsche, that a troubled relationship between a concern for truth and aesthetics of existence lies at the heart of Western culture. Keeping in mind these omissions, as well as the interpretive issues I have indicated, one hopes that the anthology will generate a new wave of scholarship with a sustained focus on the relationship between Nietzsche and Foucault, no longer an uncharted territory but nevertheless a field for many future discoveries.


Thanks to John Richardson and Daniele Lorenzini.

[1] Daniel Defert, "Chronology," in C. Falzon, T. O'Leary, and J. Sawicki (eds.), A Companion to Foucault, Blackwell, 2013, p. 19.

[2] Michel Foucault, "Truth and Juridical Forms" [1974], in Essential Works, vol. 3, The New Press, 2000, pp. 4-6. Foucault gave this series of lectures in 1973.

[3] Foucault, "Truth and Juridical Forms," 4. Cf. Michel Foucault, "Foreword to the English Edition" [1970], in The Order of Things: An archaeology of the human sciences, Routledge, 2002, pp. ix-x.

[4] Friedrich Nietzsche, The Anti-Christ, Ecce Homo, Twilight of the Idols, And Other Writings, Cambridge University Press, 2010, p. 171. These texts were originally published in 1888.

[5] Michel Foucault, History of Sexuality, Volume 1: An introduction, Vintage, 1990 [1976], p. 44.

[6] Michel Foucault, "Return of Morality" [1984], in Foucault Live: Collected Interviews, 1961-1984, Semiotext(e), 1996, p. 471.

[7] Ibid.

[8] Michel Foucault, "Passion According to Werner Schroeter" [1982], in Foucault Live: Collected Interviews, 1961-1984, Semiotext(e), 1996, p. 317. Translation modified. The French original: "L'art de vivre, c'est de tuer la psychologie." This conversation took place in 1981.

[9] Michel Foucault, "Confronting Governments: Human Rights" [1984], in Essential Works, vol. 3, The New Press, 2000. For the notion of "relational rights," see Michel Foucault, "The Social Triumph of the Sexual Will" [1982], in Essential Works, vol. 1, The New Press, 1997. For a study of this aspect of Foucault's work, see Ben Golder, Foucault and the Politics of Rights, Stanford University Press, 2015.