Foucault and Philosophy

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Timothy O'Leary and Christopher Falzon (eds.), Foucault and Philosophy, Wiley-Blackwell, 2010, 259pp., $104.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781405189606.

Reviewed by Ladelle McWhorter, University of Richmond


"Philosopher" was a label that Michel Foucault sometimes resisted, especially in the earlier decades of his career, but Timothy O'Leary and Christopher Falzon have assembled an excellent anthology of articles demonstrating Foucault's engagement with and contributions to contemporary philosophical practice throughout his life's work. The book examines and situates Foucault's work in relation to several major strands of philosophical tradition. It consists of an introduction and one paper each by the editors and an additional nine papers by well-known Foucault scholars including Gary Gutting, Jana Sawicki, Amy Allen, and Paul Patton, among others. There is no lack of interpretive disagreement in the group, which is especially notable in Gary Gutting's explicit critique of BĂ©atrice Han-Pile's work and Barry Allen's implicit challenge to C.G. Prado. However, the disagreements and alternative perspectives are informative and thought-provoking.

Obviously it is impossible in one review to do justice to all eleven articles, and O'Leary and Falzon do an excellent job of summarizing them in their introduction. Here I will simply discuss four themes, each of which runs through several different papers. The first is Foucault's relation to his predecessors, including Hegel (Gutting), Nietzsche (Hans Sluga), and Heidegger (Timothy Rayner). The second is Foucault's relationship to and, in some cases, value for contemporary philosophical debates, including critical theory (Falzon and Amy Allen) and queer theory (Sawicki), as well as other discussions less easily categorized (Prado and O'Leary). Aligned with the second theme, the third theme that emerges very strongly in this collection is the question of truth and Foucault's epistemological positions. This comes out to some extent in Rayner's article on Heidegger, but it is foregrounded in Barry Allen's essay entitled "Foucault's Theory of Knowledge." Finally, I will conclude this review with a look at the theme of political theory and practice, with a focus on Paul Patton's essay, "Foucault and Normative Political Philosophy: Liberal and Neo-Liberal Governmentality and Public Reason."

O'Leary and Falzon set out a central question in their introduction: in what sense can we say that Foucault was a philosopher? Gutting takes an historical and contextual approach to this question with a careful examination of what philosophy actually meant and encompassed in Foucault's formative years. After discussion of Wahl and Hippolyte, Gutting concludes that Foucault's possibilities as a philosopher in the 1950s would have been defined by "the turbulent space delimited by the two unacceptable resting points of existential phenomenology and Hegelian absolute knowledge" (25). But Foucault wanted "a complete break with the past," Gutting holds (28); therefore, it makes sense that for many years he resisted the label "philosopher," despite his training and interests. For a variety of reasons, some philosophical and some political, Foucault rejected philosophies that put the subject at the foundation of analysis and took experience as the object of description. He undertook instead projects of de-subjectivation, projects that create experiences as opposed to merely describing them, projects that pull away from established identities. Foucault's work was not philosophy in the sense that was accepted in his time, Gutting argues; he was not a builder of new theoretical structures. "His intellectual enterprise was the critique of disciplines and practices that restrict the freedom to transform ourselves," and thus "he was a philosopher in the ancient sense of someone who sought, if not to know the truth, then to live the truth" (34).

Two philosophers whom Foucault did embrace were Nietzsche and Heidegger. In the last interview before his death, he pronounced himself "simply a Nietzschean" (36), a declaration with which Sluga takes issue. Foucault departed from Nietzsche in at least three important ways, Sluga argues. Foucault downplays the question of origins of morality; he sees genealogy primarily in relation to history rather than politics; and he minimizes Nietzsche's interpretive understanding of the method (38). Sluga discusses these departures in helpful detail. In that same final interview, Foucault also discussed his relationship with Heidegger's work, an issue that Timothy Rayner takes up with a very informative discussion of both philosophers' attention to how subjectivity becomes the locus of truth (62).

Turning to contemporary debates, Amy Allen defends Foucault against the charge of the genetic fallacy and a range of other accusations from Habermas and his followers. She argues, effectively, that in fact Foucault has a lot to offer critical theorists, who she claims often make the very errors they see in Foucault. Falzon takes a less direct approach but also criticizes narrow readings that can be found in the work of some critical theorists. His concern lies chiefly in defending Foucault against the charge of radical individualism and in showing that Foucault's critique of justifications as historical does not amount to the claim that justifications are non-existent (240). Sawicki notes that very few philosophers have taken Foucault's homosexuality seriously enough to examine his works from that angle -- a mistake, on her view -- but queer theorists have made the error of trying to ally Foucault and psychoanalysis. Sawicki argues persuasively against the latter and urges that more attention be paid to Foucault's social and political position as a philosophical departure point.

This volume has a surprising number of essays that deal in one way or another with epistemology. Rayner's essay (already mentioned) focuses on the history of truth, an issue that should command the attention of all epistemologists but currently does not. Prado offers a reading of Foucault that makes him compatible with the work of Donald Davidson and, in fact, furthers the project that Davidson only sketches out. Foucault, unlike Davidson, is able to account for how people acquire the ability to understand propositions whose literal meanings are quite different from their meanings in context. (Davidson refers in this connection to "prior" and "passing" theories.) To a great extent, this discussion assimilates Foucault and Dewey, as well as some of Searle, which may be of great interest to scholars whose work crosses the analytic/continental divide. It does not satisfy Barry Allen, however, who argues that Foucault's archeology is not a good alternative to epistemology. In fact, Allen finds Foucault's work to be "hostile to epistemology" (154) in its indifference to normative concepts of knowledge and truth. One suspects, however, that most Foucault scholars will not be convinced by this account and will wish that Allen had considered more of Foucault's work beyond The Archeology of Knowledge.

Many of these essays deal with the political dimensions of Foucault's work. Indeed, it is difficult to imagine a good analysis of his work that ignored power, historical contexts and struggles, and genealogy's political effects. Patton's essay stands out, however, because he places Foucault in the context of traditional political philosophy and reads his work as a critique of normative political theory.

Beginning with a quick overview of Rawls, Patton suggests that "Foucault's approach to the forms of governmental reason are an important supplement" (207) to Rawls' project. Rawls calls for basic economic and social justice but focuses most of his attention on the state's constitution; he gives little analytic attention to other aspects of political culture. Foucault, by contrast, is adamant that the state must be understood as an historically shifting apparatus that exists -- where it does in fact exist -- as a production of governmentality. As modes of governmentality alter, so too will the state form. States are neither monolithic nor logically necessary for government on Foucault's view. It is a mistake, therefore, for political philosophers to focus their attention exclusively on the state, whether their purpose is simply to describe the political field or to critique an existing state or secure its legitimacy.

In The Birth of Biopolitics (Foucault's 1979 lectures series and Patton's primary text), Foucault critiques what he calls "state phobia" (see Patton, 208) and puts it in historical perspective as a quest for ways to limit state power in response to the ascendance of raison d'etat and the belief that the state form has an inherent tendency to expand. "Foucault's objection to this essentialist conception of the state is, firstly, that it allows its protagonists to deduce a political analysis from first principles and avoid altogether the need for empirical and historical knowledge of contemporary reality" (208-9). This allows conflation of historical specificities to an extreme point where important distinctions are utterly obliterated -- where, as Patton puts it, "social security ends up referring to concentration camps" (209). It also tends to perpetuate the idea that the state -- no matter which state might be at issue -- is a devouring monster. Foucault's second objection to state phobia on the left is that it can only be maintained in ignorance of the ways in which anti-state liberalism has been engaged in "an effective reduction of the state" (209) since World War II. If leftist thinkers had paid more attention to what liberals and, now, neoliberals have been doing, they would see that the state is not necessarily the central issue or danger anymore. It is imperative to look at the state apparatus in the context of governmental reason and practice -- i.e., governmentality.

This is where Foucault begins his analysis of neoliberalism, according to Patton. Whereas welfare state programs used disciplinary techniques to govern, Patton maintains, "neo-liberal governmentality relies much more on the autonomy and responsibility of citizens and, for that reason, may provide a more effective counter to the techniques of disciplinary power" (214). Patton suggests that Foucault pursued his analysis of neoliberalism at such great length in these lectures because he thought it might present a viable alternative to leftist critiques and techniques of resistance.

Patton's discussion is interesting and provocative, and there is much in it that is very helpful. (And we will return to this shortly.) However, a somewhat different reading of Foucault's interest in neoliberalism is certainly possible. In the course summary that Foucault prepared after the end of the semester, he acknowledged that (as per the course title) the lecture series was supposed to have been about the birth of biopolitics, not liberalism or neoliberalism. It was necessary, he says in his own defense, to lay out the context in which biopolitics emerged, and that context was liberalism; hence the amount of time spent on its development and variations. Divergent as it may be, neoliberalism is not an alternative to the liberalism that spawned biopolitics. Foucault implies that, had the series run longer, he could have shown how neoliberalism furthered the development of biopolitics from the late 1940s forward and how, at the time of his lectures, it may have been reshaping liberal governmentality to accommodate and extend biopolitics in the aftermath of the collapse of the Bretton Woods Agreements in 1971. On this reading, the analysis of neoliberalism is part of a genealogy, not a moment of advocacy for a favored player in the political field.

At the end of his essay, Patton returns to a discussion of the Rawlsian citizen, a subject of interests. Foucault's work puts this way of thinking of subjectivity into historical perspective, Patton notes, which has the effect of putting it in question. This work, along with the analysis of neoliberalism and examination of "new kinds of governmental reason," Patton claims, "raises questions about the adequacy of normative political philosophies that remain grounded in juridical reason" (219). This is certainly true, and it ought to be said again and again to encourage better work in political philosophy in general. In this respect, among others, Patton's essay does a great service.

In sum, then, O'Leary and Falzon have brought together a good and interesting set of essays that are well worth reading. This volume will be of interest to all scholars who work with Foucault's texts and might be recommended to advanced undergraduate students.