Foucault and the Politics of Rights

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Ben Golder, Foucault and the Politics of Rights, Stanford University Press, 2015, 246pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804796491.

Reviewed by Andrew Dilts, Loyola Marymount University


Rights, as Wendy Brown (drawing on Gayatri Spivak) correctly notes, "certainly . . . appear as that which we cannot not want."[1] They promise protection from domination and oppression, and even liberation, but these promises are made on necessarily normalizing terms. As Brown puts it, "That which we cannot not want is also that which ensnares us in the terms of our domination."[2] And rights, at least in their dominant liberal and legal formations in the Western political order, are rightly the very things which demand the vigilance of "persistent critique."[3]

As Ben Golder -- in his careful, timely, and excellent book -- puts it, "If they [rights] are sometimes effective in redirecting and remaking power relations, they nevertheless do so by fabricating and then regulating the very subjects who claim to rely upon them" (103). We are subject to rights precisely because we are subjects of rights. We need rights because we cannot seem to escape them, and when we find ourselves in need of security from others (including from the state's violence), rights provide the language through which such claims can be understood and recognized. They are thus also always the tools of the state (at least the liberal state), and the freedoms and modes of protection rights can offer will therefore always be in support of the state.[4] Rights are an intractable problem because, Golder notes, they serve a "dual function":

On the one hand, they can enlarge, expand, or protect the sphere of action of subjects (as well as bring new worlds and communities into being). On the other, and simultaneously with the above function, they can constitute those very subjects and communities in particular ways and hence work to reinscribe them within existing forms of power, recuperating and domesticating the political challenges they might pose (27).

This political double-bind of rights serves as the backdrop against which we should read Golder's own productively ambivalent book. As he states directly, this is "a book about Foucault and the politics of rights" (2). This is refreshingly simple, direct, and accurate self-description of a book. Yet, the "and" in Golder's sentence is artfully placed, as this book, in fact, gives us three things at once. True to his word, this is a book about Foucault (his thought and his method). This is also book about the politics of rights in the western tradition, rooted in liberal practice and legal theory. And it is, above all, a book about Foucault's politics of rights. Through his careful reconstruction of Foucault's thoughts on, use of, and relationship to the idea of "rights," Golder gives us both an account of how we ought to read Foucault on rights (resisting reductions of him as either simply for or against rights and refusing existing readings of Foucault as offering either "utter rejections" or "uncritical acceptance" of rights discourse [19]), and an account of how we ought to approach the politics of rights more generally in the current moment.

Golder's argument unfolds over four chapters, framed by substantive introductory and concluding chapters. In the introduction Golder articulates the motivating problem: that Foucault has been persistently misread as either dismissive of rights or as a late -- and somewhat incoherent -- defender of them. He then articulates his own method of textual and historical interpretation, and lastly sketches the central claims of the book. Chapter 1 expands on Golder's methodological claims (explicating Foucault's practice of critique in relation to archeological and genealogical methods, a relatively well-worn path) and, more importantly, presents the overarching conceptual framework through which he reads rights: as a mode of "counter-conduct." This framework is central to Golder's analysis throughout the rest of the book and is, in a sense, the conceptual condition of possibility for the entirety of his project. Drawing primarily on Foucault's 1978 Collège de France lectures, Security, Territory, Population, Golder identifies counter-conduct as a mode of "internal contestation and limitation of government" (21) of which the deployment of "rights" can be understood as an instance. Foucault's appeals to rights, Golder argues, are "contingent political tools" (22) that can be used against a given governmental rationality from within. As such, rights claims in Foucault's work should be read as tactical exercises of force relations within a specific milieu.

The chapters that follow explore three different qualities that this reading of rights as "critical counter-conduct" implies. That rights are contingent and un-grounded (Chapter 2), that they are ambivalent in their nature (Chapter 3), and that they are embedded in (and instances of) specific strategic and tactical projects. Chapters 1 and 2 focus primarily on Foucault's work, while Chapters 3 and 4 reach more widely into political and critical legal theory and turn to specific public interventions Foucault made into contemporary French politics (e.g. on gay rights, the right to die, and death penalty abolition). These chapters each offer rich readings of Foucault, moving deftly between Foucault's writing, lectures, and interviews, and the contingent political formations to which they may (or may not) have been responsive.

While Golder is not primarily interested in providing an intellectual biography of Foucault, he nevertheless rightly contextualizes Foucault's otherwise disparate deployment of the language of rights within both abstract constellations of other philosophical terms as well as contingent political events. This is, of course, in keeping with Golder's overarching claims about rights as a mode of critical counter-conduct: the three qualities of rights he traces are not ontological qualities of rights per se, but are qualities rights have come to possess.

How then ought we use rights? In his concluding chapter, Golder insists that precisely because they are forms of counter-conduct, they can be remade, reshaped, and redeployed to new ends. "Foucault does not simply capitulate to a certain 'rights talk' because this is the predominant language of his time," Golder writes, "but rather tries to semantically undo that rights talk and to make it mean differently" (156). This is, Golder insists, the essence of Foucault's critical method generally: by taking up rights as a critical counter-conduct, we can "occupy rights" (156) as a mode of self-reflective critique and make them mean differently. That is, Golder shows us that they can and should be used in the same way Foucault used them: contingently, ambivalently, and tactically. In his closing pages, Golder invites us to consider the future of rights, challenging us to reflect on the conditions in which we find ourselves and how the tools of power that dominate us may be strategically used for our liberation and the reformation of selves.

Throughout the book, Golder never strays too far from Foucault, and as such his book will primarily be read within the domain of "Foucault studies." And its primary sympathetic audiences will be Foucault scholars and critical legal scholars who are already skeptical of the hegemony of rights discourse. Yet while Golder focuses on Foucault's critical method of analysis, this book is nevertheless an exceptional work in that genre in that its utility lies outside of its own domain. Foucault gave us careful studies of modern discourses of madness, punishment, discipline, governmentality, sexuality, etc. He did so while also articulating broader analytics to better understand the operations of power, knowledge, subjectivity, and truth. Likewise, Golder's reading of Foucault's readings of "rights" gives us a more general framework for how to think about rights themselves and how to critically navigate their ambivalence. As Golder puts it, he turns to Foucault not for a final verdict on rights in our current moment, but rather, because "Foucault is current for us in how he approaches his work and hence how we, in his wake, might approach ours" (157). It is in this sense that Golder's book is performative in addition to being summative. Even though he focuses far more on Foucault than on rights themselves, Golder's interpretative method offers us a strong model for Foucauldian analytics, beyond Foucault's own immediate concerns. This is Foucault studies at its best: using Foucault to go beyond Foucault.

Two overarching questions haunt Golder's book, one that the book helps us to settle, the other that it may not be able to. The first question is the rather unfortunate re-emergence of an intense "is he or isn't he" question about Foucault's relationship to liberalism. This rather un-Foucauldian question is not new, but has taken on new life in the years since publication and subsequent translation of Foucault's 1979 Collège de France lectures, The Birth of Biopolitics, with their extensive treatment of classical liberalism, German ordo-liberalism, and American "neoliberalism." Golder's book (along with the work of Stuart Elden, Verena Erlenbusch, and Gordon Hull)[5] is now what I point people to who still consider the "is he or isn't he?" question an interesting one. Golder shows exactly how such a formulation misses the point. Rights are of course a deeply liberal construct, and politics of rights have been historically liberal in nature. To diagnose rights as a critical counter-conduct marks liberalism (and Foucault's own interest and even attachments to liberalism) in a similar way: something that can be strategically and contingently engaged, but ought not be mistaken for an over-arching ideology or theory of freedom.

Perhaps we can finally be rid of this haunting, in part thanks to Golder's attention to method and genre. So many people stay trapped in the "is he or isn't he?" question because they fail to take seriously the method(s) that Foucault uses to structure his work. And it is here that Golder's book offers us a timely example of how to read Foucault through his own methodological and editorial practices. Golder's Foucault is one that I recognize: historically driven, concerned with the present, and always working across registers and genres (books, interviews, lectures, public actions). Golder's expansive reading across the Foucauldian archive is sensitive to the important differences in the genres of those forms of writing. Foucault is not simply saying different things in these places, but he is doing different things, and Golder marks these differences in ways that far too many readers of Foucault do not. When Foucault is working genealogically -- what Golder nicely calls the "contrary excavation" (153) of the object, or what Ladelle McWhorter formulates as "a critical re-description of a dominant description"[6] -- we see how contrary descriptions were always already present to us, identifiable in the counter-conducts, tactical reversals, resistances, escapes, and refusals of those subject to power's exercise. As Golder puts it, "within any form of conduct, Foucault maintains, there is the immanent possibility of a counter-conduct -- of something which resists, works against, subverts, or avoids the operation of the attempt to govern conduct" (154). That is, Foucault helps us see that we have met the enemy and it is us, but also that we have resources available to be otherwise, because we are already becoming so.

However, I do want more from Golder about specific instances of critical counter-conducts. For the same reasons that Golder affirms the utility of Foucault's genealogical method and the framework of critical counter-conducts, he also demands more from himself: we need to see that method in action. Golder gives us Foucault's account of rights through multiple examples in which Foucault engaged with the language of rights (gay rights and the debates over the death penalty in France), but he does not offer us the archive of critical counter-conducts themselves in Foucauldian fashion. Thus I worry that Golder's own "contrary excavation" and "re-description of the dominant description" misses the tactical uses, reversals, resistances, and refusals of rights discourse itself.[7]

The second question haunting this book is more difficult: "why rights" at all? It is likely that the primary audience for this book, as I noted above, will be those readers of Foucault who are already skeptical of rights themselves, who do not primarily identify as "liberals," or who are not committed to rights (especially "human" rights) as an effective basis for liberation or as a bulwark against marginalization, oppression, and domination. We (counting myself amongst such an audience) are typically more than happy to avoid thinking about rights because we do not see them as actually offering what they claim to provide. And yet, we cannot avoid thinking about rights precisely for the reasons that Golder demonstrates in his closing chapter: rights discourse is hegemonic in no small part because even those of us who aspire toward better worlds do so knowing that it is a rights framework itself that we keep falling back onto.

Perhaps because I am so convinced by Golder's overall reading of Foucault, I am struck by the disjuncture of the closing pages of his book between where he has taken us and where he thinks we may go next. Golder self-consciously identifies the book as an "invitation" to engage in the "'permanent critique of ourselves' and of our contingent political reality" (161). An engagement with rights is a part of this ongoing permanent critique because they offer us resources even as they continue to bind us: we can make rights mean different things; we can "occupy rights" in a way that transforms what they are and the hold they have on us without either acceding to them or having to escape them. By the end of this book rights appear to be a different kind of thing, a much more Foucauldian kind of thing: they are neither a panacea, nor are they simply "bad." They are, instead, "dangerous" and therefore also a resource capable of deployment by subjects even as they change and normalize those same subjects, delimiting options in the future.

Yet even with such transformations, re-deployments, and critical counter-conducts, we still find ourselves stuck with rights. If liberalism generally (and the liberalism of rights specifically) is a second-order utopia to which we are resigned, then it is worth asking if there is anything, or anywhere, beyond rights. This is a possibility that Golder only briefly entertains in the form of some "open question[s]": ought we "retreat from the terrain of rights" or make "an investment in other political struggles and the reimagining of other possibilities and (possibly even) utopias" (161)? But having given us a way to think about how we might "occupy rights" for strategic purposes, could we not do so precisely to make them obsolete and unnecessary? To not merely take them up for the sake of transformation or strategic pragmatism, but rather for the sake of other spaces; not for another failed utopia, but for the other places -- heterotopias -- that already exist and for alternate horizons that can disrupt the dominant description? To ultimately work toward the positive abolition of the conditions to which rights respond?

Golder has surely left me in a better place, but the same question still haunts me: "why rights?"

[1] Wendy Brown, "Suffering Rights as Paradoxes," Constellations 7, no. 2 (June 1, 2000): 231.

[2] Ibid., 238.

[3] Gayatri Chakravorty Spivak, A Critique of Postcolonial Reason: Toward a History of the Vanishing Present (Harvard University Press, 1999), 110.

[4] In recent years, critical theorists have rightly trained their attention on the failed promises of liberal freedom and equality, revealing them specifically to be tools of domination, or at the very least, in need or radical rethinking and transformation. See, for instance, Glen Sean Coulthard, Red Skin, White Masks: Rejecting the Colonial Politics of Recognition (University of Minnesota Press, 2014); Neil Roberts, Freedom as Marronage (The University of Chicago Press, 2015); Dean Spade, Normal Life: Administrative Violence, Critical Trans Politics and the Limits of Law (South End Press, 2011); Ryan Conrad, ed., Against Equality: Queer Revolution, Not Mere Inclusion (AK Press, 2014).

[5] See, in particular, their excellent responses to a version of this question here:

[6] Ladelle McWhorter, Bodies and Pleasures: Foucault and the Politics of Sexual Normalization (Indiana University Press, 1999), 43.

[7] This is especially the case if we extend the Foucauldian archive beyond texts, interviews, and lectures, and include the work of information gathering, collective authorship, and political organizing which Foucault was a part of but not in charge of. In particular, I am thinking of Foucault's involvement with the Le groupe d'information sur les prisons (the GIP) and the Comité d'action des prisonniers (the CAP).