Foucault Beyond Foucault: Power and its Intensifications since 1984

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Jeffrey T. Nealon, Foucault Beyond Foucault: Power and its Intensifications since 1984, Stanford University Press, 2008, 136pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804757027.

Reviewed by Todd May, Clemson University


There is a witless, though common, interpretation of Michel Foucault circulating these days.  It is an interpretation that seeks to declaw Foucault's political radicalism and bring him into the liberal fold.  On this interpretation, Foucault abandoned the analysis of power constructed during his genealogical period (false) because it had a totalizing character that left no room for resistance (false) in favor of a sort of individual self-construction that he found in the ancient Greeks (false).  If Jeffrey Nealon had done no more than recall to us the vapidity of this interpretation, he would have performed a service.  However, he has done much more than this.  In his slim volume on Foucault, he has offered a fascinating interpretation of Foucault's work, one that brings to light previous neglected elements of his thought.  Although the stated motivation for Nealon's discussion is to counter the current interpretation of Foucault's ethical works, the result is one of the most interesting interpretations of Foucault to emerge in many years.

The lynchpin of Nealon's interpretation is the concept of intensification.  Nealon argues that an understanding of that concept will enlighten us on the trajectory of Foucault's middle and late periods, from power to biopower and from genealogy to ethics. 

For Foucault, this charting of emergent modes of power is hardly a story of progress or Enlightenment, but a story of what he calls the increasing "intensity" (intensité) of power:  which is to say its increasing "lightness" and concomitant "economic" viability, in the broadest sense of the word "economic."  Power's intensity most specifically names its increasing efficiency within a system, coupled with increasing saturation.  (p. 32) 

The history of power, in short, is a history of a force (applied against the force of resistance) that becomes more supple and more suffused.

Foucault Beyond Foucault proceeds by way of a systematic development of this thought.  It is introduced in the first chapter as a counterinterpretation to the current Prodigal Son view of Foucault as a returning liberal.  He argues that Foucault is much more interested in the question "What does it cost?" than in questions such as "What does it mean?" or "What is it?"  The operation of power changes as it finds ways to be more efficient at less cost, and, as he argues in the second chapter, this efficiency becomes a matter of increasing intensification.  In that chapter, Nealon claims that we have not yet understood the historical changes associated with changes in the operation of power.  There he isolates four stages:  sovereignty, social power, discipline, and, more recently, biopower.  The first three stem directly from Foucault's treatment of punishment in Discipline and Punish.  The final one stems largely from the first volume of Foucault's history of sexuality, but in Nealon's reading is continued into the second and third volumes, the place in which the Prodigal Son interpretation of Foucault prepares the fatted calf.

Nealon argues here that the explanation for the changes in power's operation is its increasing efficiency through intensification.  Sovereign power was brutal but clumsy.  Social power was better, but was brought to greater efficiency by discipline, which, Nealon claims, acts not so much upon the body as upon actions.  Discipline's ability to intervene upon most, or at least many, actions allows it to suffuse itself throughout the body and the body politic.  Moreover, discipline, unlike sovereign power, can create actions, not just suppress them.  However, biopower is the most intense, therefore most efficient form of power.  It acts directly upon life.  Where discipline uses the force of power to effect the creation of action, biopower intervenes on life at all levels, working through norms in order to shepherd life in directions that he treats in the following chapters.

Although I am fascinated by what Nealon does with this reading of Foucault in the following chapters, I must admit some discomfort with it as an interpretation of Foucault.  I have two reservations here, one that might be called interpretive and one that might be called metainterpretive.  The interpretive reservation has to do with the periodization Nealon lays out.  On this periodization, discipline bears upon actions while biopower concerns norms.  As he writes, "the disciplinary criminal is known through her transgressive deeds, while biopower's delinquent is known through his abnormal personality" (p. 47).  I believe this is a mistaken interpretation.  For Foucault, it is precisely discipline that works through personalities and norms.  He writes,

Behind the offender … stands the delinquent whose slow formation is shown in a biographical investigation.  The introduction of the 'biographical' is important in the history of penality.  Because it establishes the 'criminal' as existing before the crime and even outside it.  (Discipline and Punish, p. 252) 

And elsewhere he states, "The power of the Norm appears throughout the disciplines" (Discipline and Punish, p. 184).

Foucault's view, as I see it, is that discipline is one part of biopower.  Near the end of the first volume of the History of Sexuality, Foucault writes, "starting in the seventeenth century, this power over life evolved in two basic forms…  One of these poles … centered on the body as a machine…  The second, formed somewhat later, focused on the species body" (History of Sexuality, Vol. 1, p. 139).  There are two aspects to biopower.  One of those involves individualizing discipline, and the other involves an intervention into life of the kind Nealon calls biopower.  Therefore, discipline is actually a part of biopower.

Nealon argues that discipline is in decline and the other aspect of biopower is now ascendant.  Here I believe he is on stronger ground.  Foucault himself provides an indication of this in his as-yet untranslated lecture series Naissance de la biopolitique.  There he argues that there is a new figure, homo oeconomicus, that is beginning to emerge in place of the disciplined body.  Homo oeconomicus is the neoliberal individual, the figure for whom everything is a matter of investment and return.  For homo oeconomicus, everything from child-rearing to marriage to whether to abide by the law is a question of investment, risk, and reward.  Foucault sums this idea up in saying that we are dealing with, "Not a society of the supermarket -- a society of enterprise.  Homo oeconomicus … is not the man of exchange, he is not the consuming man, he is the man of enterprise and of production" (Naissance de la biopolitique, p. 152).  The figure of homo oeconomicus is, I believe, the figure that Nealon suggests in his discussion of biopower.

The metainterpretive reservation I have with this reading of Foucault is that the concept of intensification seems to me a bit transhistorical.  It cuts a wide swath through Foucault's works, perhaps too wide a swath.  The reason, I believe, that Foucault's genealogical works do not say much about the dynamics of historical change is that historical change is, for him, local and contingent.  Particular practices intersect with other practices to form yet still other practices, or perhaps to form dominant modes of power.  Discipline arises as an intersection of dispersed practices, from the monastery to the military to penal reform, and its emergence is a contingent matter.  There may be a number of reasons that discipline remains ascendant, and among those intensification would help provide an explanation.  But I am not entirely comfortable with the concept in the role Nealon wants to place it.

These last remarks may sound as though I believe Nealon is deeply mistaken about Foucault.  That would be a misimpression.  He has provoked me to think about Foucault again, after many years of an interpretation I have felt comfortable with.  I offer these remarks not as refutation but as a competing interpretation of my own.  In any case, regardless of the interpretation, the moves Nealon makes with his own interpretation of Foucault in the following chapters are fascinating ones.

The third chapter, with a nod to Deleuze and Jameson, interprets contemporary capitalism as an intensification of money through finance capital.  For Marx, capitalism operates on an M-C-M' model, where the commodity mediates between an investment and the money that is made from it.  In contemporary capitalism the model becomes M-M'.  Nealon remarks that "M-M' comprises the formula for all forms of gambling, where money is directly intensified -- made greater or smaller -- rather than being transformed into a different state through the mediating work of commodity production" (p. 63).  This analysis of capitalism is of a piece with Nealon's commitment to intensification as the key Foucaultian concept of historical change and complements his reinterpretation of Foucault's late, ethical writings, which occurs in the next chapter.

For Nealon, "It is precisely at the intersection of biopower and everyday life that Foucault urges or teaches us to go looking for something we might call the ethical" (p. 80).  The ethical is a category of analysis for Foucault; it is not a normative term.  It refers to our self-making.  In Nealon's view, biopower, as an intensification of the colonization of life, requires us to be concerned with our self-fashionings.  Biopower, by acting directly upon life, operates on the private realm, on who we make ourselves to be.  In contrast to discipline (at least on Nealon's view), through biopower we become entirely concerned with who we are and how we have made ourselves.  Discipline operates on the public realm; biopower on the private realm.  He lists a wide range of currently ascendant phenomena, from the popularity of the memoir form to the subjective character of rap to the endless recountings of the personal stories of athletes on the ubiquitous sports channels, to exemplify the rise of a concern with subjectivity and the private realm.

In approaching biopower and ethics this way, Nealon gives a powerful new interpretation to a much-discussed phenomenon:  the withdrawal of people from public life.  Rather than simply lament it, he uses Foucault in order to give an account of it.  Further, this account itself stands as a refutation of the Prodigal Son interpretation of Foucault, which insists, despite Foucault's own repeated denials, that the ethical works involve some sort of return of the subject that Foucault has come to endorse.  Moreover, in combination with the previous chapter, Nealon displays for us a capitalism that works simultaneously on the economic, political, social, and cultural levels through an infiltration and intensification of capital and biopower.

This reading of Foucault's ethical works leaves me with a question.  Since, on Nealon's reading, the concern with self-fashioning is a recent one, one can wonder why it is that Foucault's volumes on self-fashioning begin their focus on the ancient Greeks.  I think part of the answer to this is that what Nealon means in his discussion of self-fashioning is the contemporary concern with the self.  On this reading, we have always been concerned with ourselves in one way or another, but by tracing that history of concern, we might better understand -- and thus loosen the grip of -- the way that concern manifests itself now.  That reading would be in keeping with Foucault's own methodological account of his late work, offered at the beginning of the second volume of his history of sexuality, where he writes, "It seemed to me, therefore, that the question that ought to guide my inquiry was the following:  how, why, and in what forms was sexuality constituted as a moral domain?  Why this ethical concern that was so persistent despite its varying forms and intensity?  Why this 'problematization'?" (The Use of Pleasure, p. 10).

The final chapter of Nealon's book is perhaps the most fascinating.  On the Prodigal Son account of Foucault, the need for the ethical turn in the final works is driven by the problem that power, as conceived during the genealogical period, is totalizing.  It leaves no room for agency, and thus no room for resistance.  On Nealon's view, however, resistance is everywhere in Foucault.  There is no need for power if there is no resistance.  "In the norm-process, resistance comes first quite literally; resistance is what power works on and through" (p. 104).  It is precisely resistance that must be resisted, channeled, oppressed, dominated, or revised by the workings of power.  Agency is not strictly a problem for Foucault, because agency is everywhere.  This is not the agency of free will in the free will/determinism debate (that simply was not Foucault's concern).  It is the agency that he finds in history, among those who are subjected to power.  The political problem facing us today is not a problem of agency.  It is a problem of coordination.  Nealon sums this problem up admirably.  "The Foucaultian question or problem is not so much uncovering resistance, as it is a question of 'tuning' it -- finding channels, concepts, or practices that can link up and thereby intensify transveral struggles into larger, collective but discontinuous movements"  (p. 106).  To the intensification of biopower must be posed the intensification of resistance.  This intensification can take many forms, and Foucault is famously reluctant to prescribe any particular ones.  But it is to Nealon's credit that, by countering intensification with intensification, he conceives resistance as something that comes from within rather than outside our current political context.  That is both in keeping with Foucault and, in my view, in keeping with reality.