Foucault, Feminism, and Sex Crimes: An Anti-Carceral Analysis

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Chloë Taylor, Foucault, Feminism, and Sex Crimes: An Anti-Carceral Analysis, Routledge, 2019, 272pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138367319.

Reviewed by Jemima Repo, Newcastle University


This is a rich, rigorously argued, and provocative volume that makes a distinctive new contribution to the Foucauldian feminist literature on sex crimes. In addition to its core work of bringing together Michel Foucault's writings on rape and other sexual 'deviancies' with abolitionist perspectives on crime and punishment, readers of Foucault will welcome the inclusion of the full 1868 medical legal report on Charles Jouy, both in its original French and an English translation by Chloë Taylor and James Merleau. The book's main offerings, however, extend well beyond Foucault; it staunchly argues for a non-pathologising, abolitionist feminism through engagement with issues such as rape, child sexual abuse, and sex work that are at the forefront of current feminist debates.

At a time when the #MeToo movement has brought feminist activism against sexual harassment and abuse into the mainstream, the question of justice for survivors of sexual violence and abuse has gained correspondingly prominent attention in public discourse. The discussion is often focused on the difficulties of meeting the standard of proof needed to prosecute criminals in the first place, but Taylor's criticism is focused on what comes afterwards, that is, the continued support for the incarceration of sex offenders. The book is opposed to adding steam to further calls for the incarceration of sex criminals: 'anti-violence feminists,' Taylor argues, 'should be prison abolitionists' as prisons 'do not make us safer from sexual violence but rather perpetuate a culture of rape and gender oppression' (p.21). For Taylor, it makes little sense to punish sex crimes by locking offenders into a prison system that perpetuates crime, violence, and sexual assault itself. In doing so, feminists only further bolster the expansion of the carceral state. While feminists have previously admonished Foucault for his statements on rape, Taylor revisits this debate as a starting point for her analysis.

The book is organised into three distinct sections that build on one another, producing an overall arc of nine substantive chapters that move through engagement with Foucault, feminism and criminalised or stigmatised sexualities. The first section, "'Bucolic Pleasures'? Feminist Readings of Foucault", reassesses key discussions of sex crimes in Foucault's work, simultaneously criticising Foucault's androcentrism as well as extracting critiques of the prison and sexuality for further discussion. The first chapter discusses in great detail the infamous case of Charles Jouy and Sophie Adam that appears in The History of Sexuality Volume 1: Will to Knowledge, and the Abnormal Collège de France lectures. Rather than relying solely on Foucault's own account and previous feminist interpretations of it, Taylor also reads these against the original report by doctors Henry Bonnet and Jules Bulard, the inclusion of which in the appendix finally provides readers the ability to draw their own conclusions of various claims in the secondary literature. Taylor concurs with Johanna Oksala's analysis that the description of 'bucolic' and 'innocent' pleasures were not Foucault's own views of the incident, but most likely were those of Jouy himself, conveyed in the Bonnet and Bulard report. Indeed, it would not be the first time that misreadings have occurred due to Foucault's writing style.[1] Similarly, Shelley Tremain's observation that Jouy was institutionalised as mentally disabled rather than as a pervert complicates the straightforward claim that Jouy was purely taking advantage of Adam. Thus, while the chapter does not exonerate Foucault for prioritising Jouy's experience over that of Adam, it does a convincing job of absolving him of a callously dismissive attitude to the events.

The second chapter, "Revising Sex Crime Law" discusses in more detail Foucault's remarks on rape, especially his off-the-cuff suggestion that punishments for rape should be punishing physical violence rather than sex, rendering rape a civil rather than criminal offense that could be settled for instance through the payment of damages. Bringing feminist responses into conversation with Foucault's ambivalence regarding such desexualisation strategies in the case of rape, Taylor highlights Monique Plaza's arguments from 1978 arguing that not only is rape not always violent, but that it is impossible to desexualise rape since the social difference between the sexes lies at its very foundation. The solution to combating rape is therefore not to deny the sexual nature of rape and produce desexualising legislation, but rather to 'transform the entire spectrum of gender and sexual norms that inform rape as a gendered and gendering act' (p.58).

Chapter 3, "Infamous Men and Dangerous Individuals", takes on texts that until now have been more marginal in Foucauldian feminist literature; the collection of lettres de cachet in "The Lives of Infamous Men" and his introduction to the volume on Pierre Rivière. As Taylor points out, both texts recount legal cases around men who commit acts of violence against women. Yet, in failing to address this, Taylor argues that Foucault 'misrepresents or idealises the experiences of the male perpetrators of sexual and gendered crime' (p.73). Foucault's interest in critiquing psychiatric power blinds him to the misogyny of the crimes involved.

In the second section, "Disciplining and Punishing Sex Offenders", Taylor moves away from Foucault's text to using his methodological tools for a decarceral critique the criminal punishment system. The first half of Chapter 4, "Feminism, Crime, and Punishment", traces historical discourses on rape, especially the social construction of sex crimes as traumatic for victims. Taylor's argument is that even if rape is now socially constructed as traumatic compared to previous eras, this should be regarded as a positive historical development. The same goes for child sexual abuse. Cautiously bringing together Foucauldian genealogy with moral argumentation, Taylor furthermore contends that even if harm is not experienced by victims, it should not prevent us from identifying the wrongfulness of such actions. The second half of the chapter turns to 'carceral feminism,' presenting numerous arguments against the feminist strategy that calls for harsher punishments for sex crimes, which individualise social problems, disproportionately lead to the incarceratation of black men, the deportation of women of colour that report domestic abuse, and do little to end sexual violence in prisons themselves.

Foucault's critique of the prison is fundamental to Taylor's abolitionism and indeed in Chapter 5, "Foucault's Prison Abolitionism", Taylor reads Foucault as a prison abolitionist, even though she admits that Foucault never advocated the abolition of prisons, or suggested alternative forms of justice. In a 1972 interview, Foucault stated that 'the problem is not the ideal prison or the abolition of prisons',[2] as society would always find a new way to marginalise parts of its population -- a function currently carried out by the prison. Thus, while Foucault's work and activism continue to inspire resistance to the prison-industrial complex, I am not entirely convinced that he can be easily represented as an abolitionist any more than his critiques of capitalist society make him a socialist. But, this is perhaps beside Taylor's ultimate point, which is to appropriate Foucault's insights for a critique of the current, especially US, criminal punishment system. Further steam is added to her arguments in Chapter 6 on "Criminal Queers", where the system continues to criminalise queer people, rather than protect them.

The third and final section "Perverse Implantations" delves into three kinds of deviant sexualities; sex workers, zoosexuality and sexual serial killers. Chapter 7, "The Perverse Implantation and Sex Work" first discusses the concept of perverse implantation, where individuals are labelled by scientists according to their 'perversions,' giving rise to new subjectivities like the 'homosexual,' which in turn can be accepted and embraced by individuals, sometimes to resist their stigmatisation. The second part of the chapter traces the shift in representations of sex work, from past perceptions of prostitute as deviant, to present understandings of male buyers as exploitative on the one hand, and 'johns' or 'punters' with particular desires on the other. Apart from demonstrating the historical contingency of sexualities surrounding sex work, it is less clear why the sex-work-as-work argument can be seen as necessarily Foucauldian. Taylor argues that it entails a strategy of desexualisation, but why is desexualisation so much more appropriate in the case of sex work, but not rape, as discussed in Chapter 2? Like rape, sex work has crucial gendered aspects and power relations that cannot simply be undone through desexualisation. To further play devil's advocate, harkening back to the arguments of Chapter 4, why can't the purchase of sex be seen as wrong, even if those engaged in it might not regard it as a harm? Finally, a Foucauldian approach to sex work could also problematise the discourse of choice around current sex work activism that often resonates with postfeminist and neoliberal rationality.

The eighth chapter, "Zoosexuality and Interspecies Sexual Assault" turns to a rare topic in Foucauldian and feminist studies: sex between humans and non-humans. Taylor shows how, like paedophiles, zoophiles have sought to establish sex with non-human animals as a legitimate sexual identity. In the past, bestiality was associated with puberty and the sexual frustration of rural men, and condemned as a transgression of the special boundary between humans and animals. Today it is condemned for its abuse of the non-human animal. Following a fascinating discussion of some queer and posthumanist problematisations of the human/non-human boundary, Taylor notes that the perverse implantation of zoophilia has not been successful in its politics of de-stigmatisation. Even though we might problematise the human/non-human binary, to collapse the distinction between them runs the risk of also burying the complex power relations that constitute these groups, as well as their situated experiences. Thus, Taylor endorses Piers Beirne's term of 'interspecies sexual assault' as a term that avoids perverse implantation, yet gives a name to the act and the violence it entails.

The enduring fascination with serial sex killers, currently exemplified by the recent wave of true crime programmes, is the focus of the final chapter on perverse implantations, "The Social Construction of the Serial Sex Killer". As nearly all of their victims are women, serial sex killers are often assumed to take some kind of sexual pleasure in the act of killing. Yet, the psychological profiling of serial sex killers in these ways has not necessarily led to increased arrests. Rather, our fascination with serial sex killers may have inadvertently increased their numbers. The popularisation of their stories instructs copycat killers in the serial killers' methods and in how to successfully evade facing justice. In the end, they are often caught because of mistakes they make along the way, rather than clues provided by police profiling.

At the end of the chapter, the abolition -- or deprofessionalisation -- of criminology is approached as a step towards the abolition of penalty and crime in favour of an approach that can 'respond to harms from within the community' (p.212). Taylor does not explain whether she means an abandonment of all knowledge and knowledge practices stemming from the criminological field, or whether it would be a radical reappropriation of the knowledge of criminal behaviours by social actors. Arguably community centres, sociologists, social workers, and social services are also engaged with criminological knowledge, especially when it comes to strategies of prevention and rehabilitation. What kinds of power-knowledge rearrangements would come to light if we examined their workings? Do they contribute to the criminal punishment system, resist it, or both? The politics of criminal knowledge, and political transformation, seem somewhat more complex than the discussion would suggest. Taylor's conclusions are perhaps a reflection of the Anglo-American focus of the book, and much abolitionist literature. The social democratic Nordic crime and prevention system arguably embodies some of the measures advocated therein, which exist alongside a very different kind of prison model. Public spending continues to revolve around redistributive justice despite neoliberal cuts to welfare spending, while open prisons, shorter prison sentences (e.g., a maximum life sentence is 18 years in Sweden, with parole applications possible after 10 years) and rehabilitative activities are likely contributors to low rates of recidivism in Nordic countries. I cannot help but wonder what Taylor's argumentation would look like if applied to such social democratic contexts.

By extension, the Conclusion calls for a focus on interventions into the conditions that lead to sexual violence as an alternative to carceral feminism, as well as a discussion of redistributive, restorative, and transformative justice. Restorative justice is identified as the most problematic due to its co-optation by the carceral state, and in the case of sexual offences, perpetrators and victims rarely come to the table as equals. Transformative justice, by contrast, is focused on long-term structural change. It may not provide clear answers on how to deal with individual perpetrators, but its focus on collective accountability and the root causes of violence has the potential to provide more durable, long-term preventative strategies to end violence.

Overall, Taylor conducts painstaking analysis to craft an argument taking an unequivocal stance against incarceration for sex crimes. Many of her claims and stances may strike some readers as controversial, but she does not make them lightly. At every turn, the argumentation is thoughtful, measured and politically dedicated to advancing feminist alternatives to punishment. For Foucauldians, it offers a rigorous engagement with Foucault's writings on rape and paedophilia, and feminists responses to them. For any reader interested in feminism, sex crimes, and criminal punishment, it extends Foucauldian insights to new issues (such as sex work, animal sexual abuse and serial killers) in ways that will make this book an indispensable resource for subsequent debates and research on crime, punishment, and justice.

[1] See, e.g., Jemima Repo (2014) 'Herculine Barbin and the omission of biopolitics from Judith Butler’s gender genealogy', Feminist Theory 15 (1): 73-99; Stuart Elden 'Foucault and Neoliberalism – a few thoughts in response to the Zamora piece in Jacobin', Progressive Geographies (2014).

[2] Foucault, Michel. Le grand enfermement. Dits et ecrits I: 1954-1975. (Paris: Gallimard, 2001), p.1174.