Foucault on Freedom

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Johanna Oksala, Foucault on Freedom, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 223pp, $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521847796.

Reviewed by Ladelle McWhorter, University of Richmond


Johanna Oksala has produced a provocative reading of Michel Foucault's work on the issues of freedom and resistance to normalizing oppression. Although many commentators have contended that Foucault's historicization of subjectivity leads to metaphysical determinism and eliminates the very possibility of freedom in human life, Oksala argues that his radical rethinking of both bodies and freedom largely escapes the simplistic criticisms routinely put forward since the early 1980s. She does subject Foucault's work to criticisms of her own, however. While the title of her book leads the reader to expect a tight focus on the question of freedom, much of the text is actually devoted to an explication of Foucault's account of subjectivity, culminating in a discussion of his work in ethics, and it is in this late work where Oksala finds serious flaws in Foucault's thought.

Oksala divides her book into three major parts in which she reads Foucault against the background of three major thinkers: Edmund Husserl, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and Emmanuel Levinas. In the first third of her book she argues that Foucault's philosophical point of departure is Husserl, perhaps to a greater extent than many readers realize (although those who know the interview material well are aware that Foucault himself made this claim). She offers a stimulating analysis of Foucault's early work The Order of Things as (following Gerald Lebrun) "an anti-Krisis" (40). However, she holds that Husserl's work serves Foucault as a springboard both in that he rejects much of Husserl's account of subjectivity and moves away from it and in that he learns some important lessons from Husserl's account of intersubjective constitution. I will discuss the latter point in a bit more depth momentarily. Oksala devotes the middle third of her book to an analysis of Foucault's work on the body and offers a very interesting parallel reading of Merleau-Ponty along the way. She suggests ways in which Foucault's account could be strengthened if supplemented by Merleau-Ponty's work and, equally interestingly, ways in which Merleau-Ponty's account (and the accounts of embodiment that feminist theorists such as Iris Young have derived from Mealeau-Ponty) could benefit from supplementation by Foucault. Finally, in the last third of the book, she draws heavily from Levinas to critique Foucault's account of ethics and the constitution of the ethical subject.

For readers with an interest in Foucault's phenomenological ties, this book should be required reading; however, this review will not delve into the historical connections between the phenomenological movement and Foucault's philosophical development. Instead, it will concentrate on Oksala's analysis of Foucault on the body and ethics and will take issue with her criticisms of Foucault in light of Levinas.

Oksala argues that Foucault's genealogies are not merely histories of how bodies have been variously perceived -- as machines, as organisms, etc.; he is not interested in the history of changing perceptions only but, in addition and more importantly, in how bodies have been constituted historically as machines, as organisms, etc. For Foucault, the body is thoroughly historical. This has led to a couple of prominent interpretive issues in the secondary literature on Foucault, as Oksala points out. One, which Oksala examines in chapter 5 (entitled "Anarchic Bodies"), involves the tendency, especially among some feminists, to suspect that for all his insistence on historicity Foucault actually smuggles in an ahistorical, natural body to account for change and resistance. For, so the contention runs, only a body that emerges apart from networks of power/knowledge could support a subject capable of free agency; hence, when Foucault talks most seriously about resistance he uses terminology that seems to reveal a modernist assumption in his thought. Oksala refutes that reading of Foucault, however, insisting that Foucault does not revert to a modernism that his own analysis would disallow. But, she maintains, that does not leave him with a body devoid of consciousness or subjectivity; Foucault is no behaviorist (106). This insistence leads to her discussion of the second prominent (and obviously closely related) criticism of Foucault, namely, that by making the body-subject a product of power/knowledge, he in fact renders it incapable of freedom and resistance.

Oksala contends that Foucault understands agency and consciousness as real phenomena that emerge within power/knowledge networks. (She sides with Judith Butler here.) Thus, she claims, Foucault cannot be understood as a social constructionist any more than he can be construed as a behaviorist. For him, subjectivity is not an entity apart from power and constituted by it; in a very important sense it is power. In Foucault's work, "the subject and the constitutive matrix are not understood as external to each other, but are rather regarded as importantly continuous and entangled in complex ways through the idea of a constitutive apparatus" (106). The only way to see the subject (and hence the body) as powerless and unfree is to see it as divorced from power and unable to partake of power in any way. And that is decidedly not Foucault's view.

At this point (chapter 6, "Female Freedom"), Oksala suggests a wedding of Foucault and Merleau-Ponty, with Husserl as an attendant. Such a union first requires her to set aside an objection from Judith Butler, who (according to Oksala) contends that Merleau-Ponty does not give an account of the body as historical but only an account of the body as situated. This is an important distinction. If the body is merely differently lived in its different situations, the corporal schema itself (Merleau-Ponty's version of intentionality and the body's bond with the world, the "I can") is an historical constant and is fundamentally incompatible with Foucault's radical historicity. Oksala offers an alternative reading of Merleau-Ponty that makes transcendental intersubjectivity the reality-constituting principle that gives rise to the corporal schema. This is where she brings Husserl back into the picture: "Husserl's major claim is that the experience of objective validity is made possible by the experience of the transcendence of foreign subjectivity. Objects cannot be reduced to being merely my intentional correlates if they can be experienced by others. Our primal experience of others permanently transforms our categories of experience." Objective reality "can only be constituted by a subject that has experienced other subjects" (146-7). Social normativity is essential to subjectivity, so the body-subject can never be merely situated; it must also be constituted. Even the structures of the anonymous body come into being only through intersubjectivity (148). If this is Merleau-Ponty's view, based on Husserl, then his work is compatible with that of Foucault, Oksala maintains. The child's corporal schema is not a given, simply modified by experience; it comes into being in a social world and is dependent upon that world for its very structure.

Foucault's work can then be read as a politicization of this process of intersubjective constitution. The social world is not power-neutral but is in fact a dynamic power/knowledge network. How body-subjectivities are constituted varies with that dynamic and the interests and intentions exercised within and through it. But this does not eliminate freedom, Oksala argues. Power relations must repeat in order to maintain themselves; body-subjects are called upon to reiterate social norms as part of their continual constitution. But whenever reiteration occurs, there is always the possibility of difference. The body-subject's constitution is never wholly complete. Freedom, then, is not a characteristic or quality of a subject but is the subject's inherent opening toward newness. Oksala acknowledges that body-subjects can never be emancipated to a realm beyond power networks where they could exercise perfectly free modes of motility or sexuality or anything else, but the unpredictability of repetition does allow a kind of freedom. While this freedom is not political freedom, she holds, nevertheless the "undefined freedom of the lived body opens up a space in which political freedom can be sought" (153).

Oksala's main criticism of Foucault on freedom comes in Part III of her book, "Ethics," where she compares Foucault's work unfavorably with that of Levinas. She begins by noting that Foucault sees the field of morality as very broad, including moral codes and their histories as well as the history of actual moral (or immoral) behavior. Foucault's interest focuses not so much on morality per se as primarily on how people have been brought to understand themselves as subjects of morality and how they have worked on themselves to cultivate themselves as moral subjects. These practices of self-modification or self-constitution, Oksala holds, are what Foucault refers to as "ethics" (158). Oksala contends that Foucault does not believe a subject of morality exists prior to these practices of self-cultivation; ethics for Foucault is simply a matter of self-relation, and ethical practices are what create moral subjectivity. Oksala finds that view highly problematic. Following Levinas, she claims that ethics always involves not just the self in relation to itself but, and perhaps primarily, the other. The other is crucially involved in morality on at least two crucial levels: (1) The other is essential to the constitution of the ethical subject, as Levinas maintains, and (2) the other is the only element that can make the practice of self-cultivation ethical and not merely aesthetic. Foucault's account of ethics thus appears to be ontologically inaccurate and dangerously individualistic.

I would contend that Foucault does not make such a radically individualistic (not to mention existentialist) claim about the constitution of moral subjectivity. It is important to heed Foucault's distinction between ethics as a practice of care for the self and morality as a broad field of rules and codes, experienced responsibility, knowledge, and action. Before a person can undertake ethical practices, he or she must already be a rather mature social subject, constituted within social networks as a subject of action and freedom. Such a social subject already recognizes his or her socially produced freedom and responsibility within a community of some kind, in relation to others (whatever the nature of those relations may be, whether relations of governmentality or reciprocity or submission and obedience). Thus, ethical practices do not in themselves create moral-subject positions; they cultivate, perhaps they enrich, and at times they transform aspects of moral subjectivity. Foucault was particularly interested in these practices and in their power to transform the self's relation to itself, because such practices, as exercises of freedom, might provide some clues to methods for transforming normalized subjectivity in ways that might eventually lead beyond normalization. Oksala acknowledges that Foucault does not think ethical practices and the subject who undertakes them introduce a new autonomous subject emancipated from the power/knowledge networks that originally condition it, but she sees this limit on his analysis as a problem rather than as a link to a larger problematic (165). If the purpose of the study of ethical practice is supposed to be to understand and enhance our ability to resist normalization, as Oksala maintains and as I have also suggested, how can this highly conditioned subjectivity do the job?

In my view, the first step toward answering this question is to realize that normalization is not, as Oksala holds, the "problem with modern state power" (168). Normalizing power is not located primarily in the state apparatus, which if anything is far more concerned with the biopolitics of populations. The state itself is subsumed within vast interlocking networks of biopower, which includes normalizing disciplinary power but is not limited to normalization by any means. Thus, resistance to normalization is not necessarily resistance to state power, nor is resistance to state power necessarily resistance to normalization. In fact, normalized subjects cannot directly resist normalization; they can only cultivate the developmental power of the normalized body-subject to compromise the link between the increased capacity that discipline produces and the increased docility that normalization typically brings about. A second important point to note is that the Greek and Roman ethical subjects that Foucault studies were not normalized subjects, and their ethical self-cultivation was not resistance. What interests Foucault about their practices of self-cultivation for modern normalized subjects who want to resist aspects of biopower is that practices of self-transformation, practices of freedom, might enable variant iterations of self-performance (to appropriate some of Butler's terminology), which might enable, in turn, self-development along unknown, uncharted trajectories -- which is of course precisely what normalization precludes. Foucault is interested in ways to turn normalization's own power, the power of cultivation of capacity, against itself.

For Foucault the study of ancient ethical practice is not intended to illuminate or lead to a set of prescriptions about how we should respond to other people or even afford us a vision of how we should mold ourselves or what we should strive to become. It is an attempt to think about the possibility of open-ended self-transformation apart from the developmental norms established and maintained by networks of biopower. One meaning of freedom in Foucault's late work is the disciplined practice of straying afield of ourselves. No autonomous subject is required. All that is required is that subjectivity be dynamic and power be not monolithic. But this straying is neither moral nor immoral, nor is it prior to moral subjectivity or morality as a set of practices or a region of knowledge. It is simply an opening toward possibility that might -- or might not -- eventually transform how we experience ourselves.

On the whole, I find Oksala's book to be rich and stimulating. Her perspective on Foucault's relation to phenomenology is helpful. Her three chapters on rethinking the body are extremely valuable. She runs into problems only when she tries to place two radically different thinkers -- Foucault and Levinas -- side by side as if they were discussing similar issues. In Levinas' work the term ethics functions very differently from the way the term functions in Foucault's work. In the end, I suspect Foucault and Levinas are not incompatible in the ways Oksala thinks. They are just concerned about different issues and employ different strategies to bring those concerns to our attention and move their own thinking forward. Despite my disagreements with her interpretation of Foucault on ethics, however, I believe that Oksala's book is well worth reading. Not only those interested in Foucault and freedom, but anyone interested in the general topic of subjectivity would do well to spend some time with this book.