Foucault, Politics, and Violence

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Johanna Oksala, Foucault, Politics, and Violence, Northwestern University Press, 2012, 189pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810128033.

Reviewed by Chloë Taylor, University of Alberta


Johanna Oksala begins by stating that debates concerning multiculturalism and terrorism are some of the most important political concerns of our times, and that the issues that underlie these debates are agonism and political violence. Oksala's project is thus to understand the nature of politics and, more specifically, to determine whether it is intrinsically violent. The question of the relation between violence and politics -- of whether we enter into political society to avoid a primordial state of violence, or if violence is itself an irreducible aspect of political society -- is, according to Oksala, the "Archimedean point of political thought" (3).

Following Foucault, Oksala will reject all claims about human nature, including the view that violence is an intrinsic aspect of human nature and hence of our political lives. Consequently, for Oksala -- and contra political theorists such as Slovaj Žižek and Chantal Mouffe -- violence is a contingent feature of politics today, not an ineradicable aspect of politics for all time. This is not to say, for Oksala, that politics can ever be harmonious. On the contrary, she argues that because the ways that we constitute reality will always entail exclusions, politics will always be a site of contestation. Nevertheless, political contestation and agonism are not the same as violence, Oksala insists. One of the ways in which violence has been posited as an ineliminable feature of politics has been by defining it overly broadly, such that language itself has been construed as violent. Restricting her own understanding of violence to "intentional bodily harm" (9), Oksala thus develops an agonistic conception of politics that nevertheless rejects any essentialist assumptions about the violence of human nature or, consequently, of politics. In addition, she examines the conditions of possibility for the specific forms of political violence that have characterized modernity -- or, inversely, how specific forms of violence are produced within the contemporary historical context and by modern neoliberal governmental rationality in particular. Just as Foucault questions the "repressive hypothesis" with respect to sexuality, so Oksala questions whether the function of political power is to repress violence or whether, on the contrary, particular political orders do not produce specific, historical, and contingent forms of violence (65).

Because Oksala describes her project as ontological, Chapter 1, "The Politicization of Ontology," explains how she understands ontology. Following Foucault, Oksala insists that ontology is not the study of the fundamental nature of reality or of the timeless essences of things. Rather, ontology is the study of how social practices produce contingent realities. Through a consideration of arguments by Foucault scholars Ian Hacking and Béatrice Han, Oksala further considers how social practices might have the productive effects that Foucault attributes to them, and what kinds of social realities they might produce. Moreover, she explores how ontologies may be problematized and thereby contested and transformed. With respect to her own project, Oksala's questions are thus: what social practices have produced the kinds of violence that characterize modernity, and through what practices may we eradicate them? More specifically, Oksala will examine Foucault's lectures on governmentality in order to explore and to problematize how modern practices of government have produced particular forms of political violence.

Chapter 2, "Foundational Violence," identifies and rejects a number of theories that see violence as intrinsic to politics, beginning with Foucault's own fleeting view that politics is the continuation of war. Although, between 1975 and 1976, Foucault toyed with the idea that politics was fundamentally war-like or violent, and his vocabulary was strewn with terms of battle in these years, Oksala demonstrates that he ultimately rejected this view, going on to develop his more useful theories of biopower and governmentality. As she notes, in his late essay ("The Subject and Power"), Foucault, far from seeing power as intrinsically violent, goes so far as to say that power is absent where there is violence.

Chapter 3, "Dangerous Animals," analyzes agonistic political theories that accept violence as an inevitable aspect of political life, with a focus on the work of Mouffe. Oksala accuses Mouffe of subscribing to two contradictory ontological premises. On the one hand, Mouffe accepts a post-structuralist and anti-essentialist approach to subjectivity in which she recognizes the constitutive function of power. On the other hand, a crypto-essentialism is incorporated into Mouffe's theory by her theoretical reliance on the work of René Girard and Carl Schmitt. Oksala provides convincing critical readings of Girard's and Schmitt's accounts of political violence and of the role that these play in Mouffe's work.

In Chapter 4, "The Politics of Gendered Violence," Oksala argues that a Foucauldian approach to violence shows not only that violence is contingent and historical, but also that it is political rather than coincidental. Such an approach thus sees violence neither as intrinsic to humans (or to sub-groups of humans) nor as a matter of some bad apples. Focusing on the example of men's violence against women, Oksala observes that the fact that we see such acts as violent at all is historically contingent. What we now call "domestic violence" was once the legitimate exercise of patriarchal power within marriage. All definitions of violence -- including the feminist definition that includes force used by husbands against wives and Oksala's definition of violence as intentional bodily harm -- are historical and political. Oksala contends that a Foucauldian analysis not only resists approaching phenomena of violence as timeless and ahistorical, it also resists seeing men as intrinsically aggressive, or violence as a stable and foundational feature of patriarchy. At the same time, a Foucauldian analysis of gendered violence recognizes men's violence against women as a structural and systematic aspect of masculinity as it is currently constructed in societies such as our own. Thus, a Foucauldian analysis of gendered power relations perceives that power cannot be reduced to a single and unidirectional dominator-dominated relation of repressive power. Rather, power as governmentality is a dynamic network of relations that always involves rational justifications and invokes resistance, and does not always entail violence. Indeed, as Oksala observes, men control how women act through many practices, most of which do not entail physical force, and it is not only men who are violent. Nevertheless, as she points out, men have a "monopoly" on violence today (73) and "in our culture practices of violence are highly gendered" (76). Many kinds of male violence are encouraged, whereas violence on the part of women is aberrant of gender norms. If -- as Judith Butler has argued, and as Foucault's emphasis on practices rather than subjects would suggest -- gender is something that we do rather that something that we are, then, Oksala insists, violence should be recognized as one way that masculinity -- and not femininity -- is done, and thereby constituted, in our culture (76). What this means for feminist praxis is that we must strive to transform our political ontology of the masculine such that it is no longer associated with performances of violence.

Chapter 5, "Political Life," concerns the relationship between violence and politics in specifically biopolitical times. As Oksala notes, political theorists since Aristotle distinguished between biological and political life. Other animals merely have biological life, whereas humans have the additional capacity to lead political lives. Biopower collapses this distinction, with biological life itself becoming a means of deployment of political power. Oksala discusses the role of biopower in the political theories of Hannah Arendt, Giorgio Agamben, and of Foucault, and specifically the manner in which each philosopher viewed the relation between politics and violence in these accounts. As Oksala argues, although Arendt's rejection of the biopolitical allows a severance of violence from politics, it requires an unacceptable banishing of all social issues -- such as poverty, hunger, and sexuality -- from the political. For Agamben, life was already politicized irrevocably under sovereign power by its capacity to be destroyed by the sovereign. Oksala, however, criticizes Agamben's account of "bio-sovereignty" (100) for its ahistoricism and its ontologization of twentieth-century biopolitical violence. For Foucault, biopower is effective precisely because it does not threaten us with violence, or because violence must be hidden and bureaucratized in an age where power purports to foster and protect life rather than take it away. As Foucault argued, however, the hiddenness and bureaucratization of violence in modernity has only permitted its unprecedented escalation.

Chapter 6, "The Management of State Violence," considers some of the hidden and bureaucratized forms of violence that occur as a result of the biopolitical state's protection, regulation and management of the population. As opposed to the violence of sovereign power, biopolitical state violence "is often monitored and sanctioned by medical professionals, military officials, and administrative personnel rather than by parliamentary institutions or courts of law." (109) Oksala's sustained example of state violence is torture. What is most disturbing about biopolitical violence such as torture, she argues, is that it is not so much a suspension of the law -- which would only require that we reinforce the law -- but that it works within the law: the torture methods used at Guantánamo were overseen by lawyers. Because of the proliferation of such managerial and professionalized forms of state violence, Oksala argues that in order to adequately address political violence today, we must attend not only to juridical forms of violence legitimated by law, but also to biopolitical forms of violence that are legitimated primarily by their efficiency and that instrumentalize law as a tactic.

Chapter 7, "The Political Ontology of Neoliberalism," presents Foucault's The Birth of Biopolitics lectures and compellingly argues for the compatibility of biopolitics and neoliberalism. Oksala intends this chapter to "set the stage" for Chapter 8, "Violence and Neoliberal Governmentality," in which she analyzes the relationship between neoliberalism and political violence (118). Here Oksala persuasively argues that state violence is structurally required by neoliberal rationality, and that one of the most troubling features of neoliberalism is that it depoliticizes the violence upon which it relies. Rather than seeing violence as a political or moral problem, neoliberalism reduces violence -- like everything else -- to an economic problem to be subjected to cost-benefit analysis. In response, Oksala passionately avers that we must resist neoliberal rationality by insisting on political values other than economic ones, such as "justice, compassion, creativity, and solidarity" (145).

Chapter 9, "Terror and Political Spirituality," examines the ways that certain forms of political violence are authorized and others are de-authorized through arbitrary prescriptive understandings of terrorism. The notion of terror is used to construct a distinction between non-political and political violence: terrorism is understood as illegal acts committed by agents unaffiliated with a recognized state, and is conceived as irrational, calling for psychoanalysis and punishment. In contrast and consequently, legal violence undertaken by recognized state agents is understood as rational, necessary, and permissible, even when it entails the same acts and bloody consequences as terrorism. While Oksala describes some of the lengths that terrorists have gone to insist upon the political nature of their acts, terror continues to be definitionally excluded from the political, and this exclusion serves to constitute our understanding of the political and to legitimate bloodshed on the part of states. Through a discussion of Walter Benjamin's famous "Critique of Violence," Oksala observes that what counts as a state and the law is itself grounded in foundational acts of violence, thus blurring the distinction between law-making and law-preserving violence, or between terror and political violence. In response to Benjamin, Oksala asks how we might transform our political ontology so that it is no longer constituted by terror. Toward this end, she turns in the final pages to Foucault's position on terror and his controversial writings on the Iranian Revolution.

Oksala notes that although he defended the right of terrorists to an attorney, and thus resisted the extradition of defense attorney Klaus Croissant in the summer of 1977, Foucault refused to endorse terrorism as a justifiable means to political ends. Other French philosophers (such as Félix Guattari) were also engaged in resisting Croissant's extradition to Germany, but they argued that the terrorism that Croissant had defended was justified because West Germany was a fascist state. Foucault's lectures on neoliberal governmentality may have been motivated to explain his position that West Germany was not a fascist but rather a neoliberal state. Oksala notes that Foucault's writings on the Iranian Revolution, like his writings on the Croissant affair, were contemporary with his lectures on neoliberalism and should be considered in this light. In particular, she argues that Foucault's journalism on Iran was an attempt to examine possibilities for resistance to neoliberal governmentality in Europe. The Shah of Iran was a strong supporter of Westernization and economic neoliberalism, and the uprising of the Iranian people that resulted in his abdication demonstrated strong popular resistance to neoliberal individualism and economics. Although Foucault's journalism on the Iranian Revolution is usually dismissed as either "a profound political error" or "infantile leftism" (150), Oksala compellingly argues that what fascinated Foucault about this revolution was that it was "a genuine experiment in trying to imagine and create political alternatives to Western neoliberal governmentality." (151) Despite the profound failure of this particular experiment, Oksala concludes by insisting that the task of imagining alternatives to neoliberalism -- and to its violence -- is both possible and necessary.

This is an ambitious, carefully crafted and lucidly argued volume. Oksala's concise, erudite study engages with key philosophical debates and political concerns in novel and provocative ways. It is necessary reading for political philosophers and political theorists. There are nevertheless a few surprising lacunae. Oksala does not consider Frantz Fanon's famous essay "Concerning Violence" when defending her own categorically critical view of violence. Although she expresses "astonishment" that feminists have not drawn on Foucault to discuss domestic violence, she does not mention the large body of feminist Foucauldian scholarship (including her own important essay, "Sexual Experience") on sexual violence (67). Oksala is also overly modest in her Introduction when she writes that she will not "engage in political criticism of any specific instances of violence" (10). While the project of discussing violence per se rather than any concrete and historical instances of violence should strike readers as uncharacteristic of a Foucauldian project, Oksala does, in fact, engage in a series of astute and critical, albeit brief, analyses of particular examples of political violence. These include her discussions of gendered domestic violence, terrorism, the torture techniques used in Israeli prisons and Guantánamo Bay, and the punitive "nose distraction" technique used in "training centers" for minors in the United Kingdom. These are powerful sections of Oksala's book, and one hopes that they -- and the book as a whole -- serve as an invitation for future Foucauldian examinations of concrete instances of political violence. Foucault, Politics, and Violence demonstrates how productive such examinations may be.