Foucault's Archaeology: Science and Transformation

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David Webb, Foucault's Archaeology: Science and Transformation, Edinburgh University Press, 2013, 256pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748624218.

Reviewed by Samuel Talcott, University of the Sciences


This book makes an important contribution to the literature concerning Michel Foucault. The Archaeology of Knowledge [Archaeology] has often been regarded as a failure, freezing time rather than describing historical transformation as it set out to do. This failure, it is said, brought Foucault to develop genealogy as a better method for investigating such transformations. By writing a commentary on Foucault's text that focuses on its relation to works by Gaston Bachelard, Jean Cavaillès, and Michel Serres, Webb is able to convincingly argue that this text is not a failure but a success that opens up other ways of working and other topics for investigation. Webb carries this out by discussing the work that each of these three philosophers did to introduce history into the most rigorous, the most highly formalized and universal of the sciences, mathematics. Their work on the idea of a "mathematical a priori" that is thoroughly historical, opened the way, he argues, for Foucault's own notion of the historical a priori, introduced in the Archaeology. Against this background, the Archaeology is not a failure, but a work highly attuned to transformations in knowledge and the way these shape diverse temporalities.

Foucault's Archaeology is archaeology for archaeologists. That is, Webb evaluates the method of the Archaeology by approaching it on its own terms. Stylistically, his book is designed to address a number of issues that arise in the endeavor to explain Foucault's writings by appealing to their historical situation. Historians of ideas are inclined to discover an author's influences, the precursors who said more or less the same thing, making history the expression of a timeless idea that is passed down from one generation to the next, perhaps more hidden then, more clear now. Foucault dismisses such an account of history for its failure to explain the emergence of new sorts of experience, new ways of thinking, and Webb's book is composed with this in mind. So even though he looks to other authors as "predecessors," he endeavors to treat them not as the source of Foucault's ideas, but rather as working in ways that Foucault himself would take up, though not without modifications.

Foucault describes archaeology as a re-writing of the texts that it considers. It does not evaluate their legitimacy, but identifies the regularities according to which they were written, thus producing a discursive map of knowledge for a given place and time. And Webb's book itself literally re-writes Foucault's Archaeology, since the bulk of the book is a page-by-page commentary on this text. Thanks to the "Background" section that situates Foucault's text in relation to his earlier works and briefly introduces and explains relevant works by Bachelard, Cavaillès, and Serres, this commentary is tightly focused on the place of mathematics in the Archaeology and how this enables a response to objections typically raised concerning this text. When one is finished reading Webb's book, a new Foucault appears, one who draws the lessons of mathematics for philosophy. But since Webb rewrites a text that repeats itself as it proceeds, questioning its earlier analyses and reworking them in light of different elements of discourse, Webb's text also proceeds in much the same way, developing more or less the same argument throughout, though in different ways and forms. So rather than summarize Webb's commentary section by section, I will give an account of what I take to be the main points that Webb brings out through the "Background" and "Commentary."

The "Background" proceeds by putting the Archaeology in the context of Foucault's other relevant works, The Order of Things in particular. Webb recalls that in the latter, the figure of man, and man's finitude, gave rise to a series of impasses that modern thought has not been able to undo. Life, labor, and language, each initially studied as their own objects in early modernity, eventually led back to the figure of man, the ground uniting these domains of study. Studied as a finite being among others, it also came to be understood that it was man himself who sought such knowledge, making him the transcendental foundation of all knowledge. This is the problematic of the transcendental-empirical doublet, in which man is inescapably subject and object of knowledge. For Foucault, Webb explains, even though each of these positions aims to exclude the other, each implies the other and so they are bound together, causing a perpetual oscillation between two ways of inquiring into man: positivist studies, in which the object's truth is the criterion for judging the truth of discourses about its development, and eschatological accounts, in which philosophical truth and discourse are realized over the course of the object's history. So long as the figure of man holds sway, then, thought remains trapped between these two poles.

Following the famous conclusion of The Order of Things, an escape from this doublet will happen when the figure of man fades away. Webb reminds us that this disappearance is neither a return to pre-critical naiveté nor the triumph of positivism. Nor is it a based on a transcendental, phenomenological account that shows the unity of lived experience. Instead, the disappearance of man does away with the need for unity in knowledge, opening the way to pluralism and multiplicity (11). At the same time, this allows for a treatment of knowledge that appeals to neither the empirical nor the transcendental. Instead, Webb finds, the disappearance of man foregrounds the historicity of knowledge, and the historical conditions that regulate knowledge in a given time and place. Foucault's Archaeology is, therefore, a continuation of this work and an attempt, according to Webb, to accelerate the disappearance of man.

Most of the "Background" is devoted to outlining relevant themes and ideas in the work of Bachelard, Cavaillès, and Serres. Webb aspires not to give a complete account of their works, but to show their relevance here and encourage further reading of their texts. The first treated is Bachelard, to whom Webb traces the idea of a mathematical a priori that is not absolute, but merely functional, and an insistence on treating time not as a continuity but in terms of the instant. In Bachelard is found also the idea of a dispersed philosophy, although Webb takes care to distinguish Foucault's understanding of transformation in knowledge from Bachelard's ideas about epistemological rupture. Cavaillès and Serres are each given a more thorough, but still brief treatment. Cavaillès is discussed for his contributions to the philosophy of mathematics in the 20th century and his critique of Husserlian phenomenology and its account of scientific and mathematical knowledge. Against the idea of an original intuition as the ground of knowledge, Webb discusses Cavaillès' development of an account of mathematics as defined by its own history and, therefore, open to an unpredictable future. As Webb notes, this locates the autonomy and unity of mathematics as immanent to its own history, suggesting that Cavaillès is very close to Foucault's criticisms of phenomenology. Instead of an original intuition, Cavaillès appeals to complex intuitions conditioned by mathematical practice at a given time and place. Recalling Foucault's famous distinction of two currents -- a philosophy of the subject and a philosophy of the concept -- through which German phenomenology was taken up in France, Webb makes clear that, for Cavaillès, mathematical formalism, though thoroughly historical, "ejects the subject from its central role in the drama of thought in modernity" (38).

Webb relates Serres' work to Foucault's Archaeology in a few ways. First, Serres focused on mathematics in a number of his early works and argued that mathematics, like other sciences, had become its own epistemology, leading to a new task for philosophy, namely, becoming the general epistemology of all these emergent, regional epistemologies. Second, Webb considers Serres' discussions of Lucretius' atomism, centered on the natural regularities that emerge without reference to any pre-determined model or universal form, regularities that are both conditions and conditioned. A given regularity will tend to repeat itself in new instances, but in so doing deviations from this regularity condition new regularities, leading to a steady transformation of given conditions of change into new conditions. This is a central point, it turns out, for understanding Foucault's historical a priori, which is such a regularity at the level of discourse, both condition for the production of discourse and conditioned by this very production. Like Cavaillès, Serres thinks that a philosophical account of mathematics is not possible without an understanding of its history, but unlike Cavaillès, this is not a condition of its unity, but of its pluralization, its multiplication into a patchwork of different forms and kinds of mathematics.

Webb produces evidence that Foucault took the work of these three philosophers of the concept seriously in his own work. Webb argues that their work was key to his endeavor to avoid succumbing to the same difficulties that faced phenomenology in its attempt to move beyond the impasses of the transcendental-empirical doublet. And studying it, Webb thinks, will help better evaluate whether archaeology is more successful in this endeavor than phenomenology. Webb looks to Foucault's mention of the mathematical a priori as basis for a second Critique of Pure Reason in The Order of Things, reading this as evidence that Foucault himself is engaged in such a project, since it suggests the idea of a priori conditions that are neither transcendental nor empirical (32). It opens the way to a consideration of such conditions or rules as regularities, not transcendental or merely empirical conditions. Considering Foucault's Introduction to Kant's Anthropology, Webb finds an early interest on Foucault's part in the idea of temporal dispersion as a way of moving beyond the impasses of modern thought and the phenomenological attempts to address these. Against Heidegger's critique of Kant's Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View, Foucault's Introduction does not criticize Kant for his failure to produce a fundamental and unifying ontological account in terms of Dasein's temporality, seeing the temporal dispersion of consciousness as a move away from the unifying figure of Man. But Kant's account, for Foucault, runs into trouble because it speaks in popular terms, thereby treating time empirically, and lacks a formal language that would better enable temporal dispersion. As Webb presents it, the Archaeology develops such a formal language by recourse to work done on the mathematical a priori by Foucault's predecessors.

One of Webb's primary contentions comes out in his repeated rehearsal of Foucault's confrontation with Heideggerian phenomenology. Heidegger's account of ontological difference found that Being is not the same as beings, but concerns the way in which beings appear. Thus, Heidegger had developed a non-representational, fundamental ontology, which investigated the basic existential structures conditioning experience, though never reducible to it. Clock time, famously, is not the same as the time of finitude, which is always present, even if obscured, for Dasein. It might seem that archaeology does something similar, while leaving ontology to the side in favor of epistemology. Discourse and knowledge (savoir) would be non-representational, concerning the way in which speaking, writing, and knowledge happen, rather than what is said. On this reading, Foucault runs into trouble since archaeology can never identify the ontological basis of discourse and knowledge. But, Webb tells the reader, ontology is also a discourse, and so archaeology, as the investigation of discourse has priority over the discourse of ontology itself. Moreover, for Webb, archaeology provides an "alternative ontology," one that does not look to a fundamental ontology of time in order to unify experience, but that provides an ontology of language in order to reveal the multiplicity, the plurality of times and experiences (56). The temporal dispersion that arises through different discourses, different knowledges is thorough, making historical work a matter of mapping diverse, diverging, intersecting, and overlapping temporalities. And this means that Foucault's analyses are neither phenomenological nor pragmatist. With the fading of the figure of man, the plurality of discourse becomes possible again, and Webb shows Foucault linking this to movements in the formal sciences, especially mathematics, and literature.

According to Webb, Foucault's archaeology does bear a trace of the transcendental-empirical distinction. Though Foucault's Archaeology was clear that it investigated discursive practices and their relation to non-discursive practices, this approach maintains a distinction, even if blurred, between them. And it makes discursive practices central. So, he argues, it is not because this method failed to explain history as transformation, nor because it was lacking an ontological basis, that Foucault developed genealogy, but because it maintained a distinction that still admitted the distinction between the transcendental and the empirical. Thus, Webb convincingly argues that genealogy was not based on the radical abandonment of archaeology, but the transformation of the methods opened up by archaeology. He also finds evidence of this in the other archaeologies that Foucault envisions, not just of knowledge, but of painting and sexuality. Moreover, for Webb, the critical work of the Archaeology clearly points forward to Foucault's later concerns about power, freedom, and ethics.

There are some unfortunate, but minor typos in the book. More serious is Webb's correction of the translation of "actual experience" in the English translation of The Order of Things. He is correct to point out that the proper translation would be "lived experience," as this would make the connection to phenomenology clear. So far as I can tell, though, the French here is le vécu, not, as Webb has it, le veçu. Also, Webb announces that he will use the expression "lived experience," but then continues to use the other phrase as well. Greater consistency here would be helpful.

I have a few final, more general comments. On page 136, Webb refers to Cavaillès as Foucault's "precursor." This suggests that there might be some difficulty in Webb's archaeological account of Foucault's work. Webb makes clear that he has not discussed all relevant figures, such as Canguilhem or Althusser, for simplicity's sake, and also because the relation of such figures to Foucault's work is already well-known (2). I propose, though, that at least some attention to Canguilhem would have been helpful because it would have shown the questionability of the "precursor," a figure that Canguilhem vigorously criticized for its disruption of the diverse temporalities of the sciences, which transform over their history, so that, properly speaking, there are no precursors. And Foucault, as Webb shows so well, is deeply invested in the temporal dispersion of knowledge.

Canguilhem might also be relevant here because his major work, The Normal and the Pathological, is deeply involved with mathematics, specifically the mathematics deployed in the attempt to know the living, to quantify qualitative distinctions between health and illness. An interest in the mathematization of such informal distinctions also fits well with Foucault's own concerns in the Archaeology, where highly formalized knowledge is only one domain of interest among others. Perhaps, though, this only repeats what Webb has already written, that archaeology goes some way towards making the transcendental-empirical distinction questionable, including in its instantiation as the incommensurability of the sciences and the humanities. Notwithstanding these concerns, then, Foucault's Archaeology is worth reading, both for what it attempts and what it accomplishes.