Foucault's Critical Project

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Han, Beatrice, Foucault's Critical Project, translated by Edward Pile, Stanford University Press, 2002, 241pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0804737096.

Reviewed by Gary Gutting, University of Notre Dame


In this impressive and provocative book, Béatrice Han argues that Foucault, for all his express opposition to phenomenology and other forms of transcendental thought, never really got beyond its standpoint. Her case is based on a series of detailed and challenging readings of key methodological passages in Foucault's writings, from his thesis on Kant's Anthropology (where Han provides the worthy service of summarizing, with extensive quotations, this unpublished text) through his final work on the history of ancient sexuality. Although, as will be apparent, I find her case unconvincing, there is much to be learned from the details of her thorough and informed analysis. The translation of the book, from the French original, L'ontologie manquée de Michel Foucault (Jérôme Millon, 1998), is very well done.

According to Han, all of Foucault's work can be read as the (failed) effort to revive the project of transcendental philosophy: to find the conditions of possibility for experience. Of course, Foucault approaches this problem in a distinctively historical manner, and so Han's discussion focuses on what he calls the “historical a priori”. This notion first appears in the context of Foucault's archaeology of knowledge. As Han points out, even Husserl seeks an historical a priori (e.g., in The Origins of Geometry), but for Husserl this turns out to be “suprahistorical, in the sense that it exists essentially to guarantee the possibility of recovering … the primary evidences” that exist “beyond the sedimentations of history and tradition”. Foucault, on the contrary, “proposes the paradoxical hypothesis of an "a priori fully given in history” (4). Nonetheless, Han insists that “despite appearances, archaeology is profoundly connected to phenomenology in that it attempts to find a solution to the same problem (providing a new version of the transcendental)” (5).

Why, on Han's view, does Foucault's archaeology fall back into the transcendentalism it is trying to avoid? As she notes, “Foucault hardly ever troubles himself to give the historical a priori clear theoretical definition” (38), but she pursues the formulations (implicit and explicit) present in his archaeological writings, from The Birth of the Clinic through The Archaeology of Knowledge, and tries to demonstrate the theoretical inadequacy of each. In The Birth of the Clinic, for example, Foucault defines the historical a priori as the “originary distribution of the visible and the invisible insofar as it is linked with the division between what can be stated and what remains unsaid” (BC, xi). Han notes that Foucault's language here seems to refer to Merleau-Ponty, which suggests that “archaeology could therefore be interpreted, from the foundations laid out by The Phenomenology of Perception, as an attempt to identify historical variations of the structures of perception in a given domain” (49). But she further notes that the suggestion founders on the fact that Foucault further characterizes the historical a priori as a “deep space, anterior to all perceptions and governing them from afar” (BC, 5), which soundly rejects Merleau-Ponty's central assertion of the primacy of perception. From this she concludes that “The Birth of the Clinic finds itself without any real theoretical support” (50).

Han sees the The Order of Things as implicitly offering an apparently quite different characterization of the historical a priori that “can be textually reconstructed as an implicit relation between ‘words' and ‘things', or, as Foucault says, between 'language' and 'being'“(50). This, Han maintains, presupposes a “traditional metaphysics” (54), through its postulation of things independent of language, that is inconsistent with the strict nominalism to which Foucault tries to adhere in his subsequent work. She also notes that the book's Preface hints at a Heideggerian alternative to this metaphysics, based on an identification of Being as that which “orders” things. But, Han argues, Foucault is in no position to follow this Heideggerian path, since, first, order itself presupposes a certain understanding of Being and, second, Foucault's characterizations of order vacillate between an objective understanding of it that implies a substantiality inconsistent with Heidegger's Being and a subjective understanding that falls back into the humanism that both Heidegger and Foucault reject.

Han is surely right that Foucault cannot consistently explicate his idea of a historical a priori in terms of either Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology or of Heidegger's ontology. But to suggest that he is trying to do either of these is both to mistake his methodological intent and to misread his rhetoric. The Birth of the Clinic and The Order of Things are both primarily works of history, not philosophy in the traditional sense. In them, Foucault is concerned with forging a new approach to historical analysis but not with the meta-question of how to understand and justify this approach philosophically. Accordingly, Han should not, as she does, find it “strange” that “Foucault hardly ever troubles himself to give the historical a priori clear theoretical definition” (38). Nor should she read so literally Foucault's casual employment of various philosophical vocabularies (from Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty among many others) to add suggestive allusions to his characterizations of his historical project.

The Archaeology of Knowledge is, of course, an explicitly methodological treatise in which Foucault does undertake to formulate clearly the key concepts of his archaeology, including that of the historical a priori. Here, according to Han, he rejects the “confused phenomenology of The Birth of the Clinic and the hidden metaphysics of The Order of Things” and instead presents a “happy positivism” that “understands the historical a priori as a purely empirical figure” (65). He defines the historical a priori “as a principle of selection at work in the discursive field” (64). More fully, “among the vast collection of possibilities offered by logic and grammar, the historical a priori has the function of circumscribing a more restricted domain by defining the conditions of possibility of statements in their character as ‘things actually said'” (64, citing The Archaeology of Knowledge, 127, Han's italics). Han finds two major difficulties with this definition. The first—earlier raised by Dreyfus and Rabinow—concerns the status of the criteria whereby logically and grammatically possible statements are excluded at the archaeological level of analysis. To be consistent, Foucault must hold that these criteria correspond to merely descriptive regularities, for, if they were prescriptive rules, they would have to be consciously followed by those who obey them. But archaeology is precisely supposed to reveal the “unconscious” of knowledge. In fact, however, in order to give the criteria causal power (so that they will not correspond to merely accidental regularities), he must treat them as prescriptive. This, as Dreyfus and Rabinow put it, results in the “strange notion of regularities which regulate themselves”1 and, according to Han, lands Foucault in the contradictory position of confusing the empirical with the transcendental—the very mistake for which, in The Order of Things, he reproaches philosophical thought since Kant.

Han's second difficulty derives from the fact that Foucault in effect defines the conditions for the reality of statements in terms of the rules that govern their use. If, she argues, this is not an empty tautology, it leads to an infinite regress:

the definition … generates a regression in the order of conditions of possibility, since one could only account for the conditions for the exercise of the enunciative function [i.e., for the use of statements] by means of a “set of rules” which itself would require another “set of rules” identical to the first (66).

It's hard to know what to make of this second objection. On the one hand, it would seem to have force only given the gratuitous assumption that a given set of rules can be understood only by giving another set of rules; on the other hand, even if we grant this dubious point, Han says that, in this case, the “other” set of rules is in fact “identical to the first”, which, if true, will hardly generate a regress.

The first objection has more substance, but it ultimately rests on a faulty formulation of the description/prescription dichotomy. The objection assumes that, for a rule to have prescriptive rather than merely descriptive force, it must be consciously formulated and applied. But this is not so, even of the rules of logic and grammar. In most cases, we are not aware of the logical and grammatical rules we are following. Of course, given an adequate level of reflection, many such rules can and have been formulated. But it seems very likely that such reflection is not always possible, given the conceptual resources of a particular domain of discourse at a particular stage of its historical development. Accordingly, it may well be that there are, at any given time, rules governing our discourse that we are not even capable of formulating. Moreover, it is not the case, as the objection assumes, that Foucault cannot allow for the conscious awareness, at least in principle, of the archaeological rules that govern our discourse. His position maintains only that these rules are typically unconscious, not that they can under no circumstances be brought to consciousness.

Foucault's turn to genealogy, adumbrated in his inaugural lecture at the Collège de France, The Order of Discourse, and fully developed in Discipline and Punish, goes beyond archaeology by reformulating the historical a priori in terms of non-discursive causal factors, in particular social power relations. Han thinks this move avoids the difficulties she raised regarding the historical a priori of archaeology, and she applauds Foucault's genealogical focus on truth (rather than mere discourse in itself) as well as his intimate connection of knowledge with power via the notion of a “regime of truth”. But, she maintains, his new approach brings with it transcendental problems parallel to those that afflicted archaeology. One concerns the definition of truth, which Foucault sometimes formulates as “that which the regime governs and allows us to think” (141) and sometimes as “the set of rules according to which the true and false are separated and specific effects attached to the true” (141, citing Power/Knowledge, 132). These two definitions, Han maintains, show Foucault trying to understand truth as both constituting (i.e., as a set of independent rules specifying what is true in a given regime) and constituted (i.e., itself specified as true by the regime's power relations). Their inconsistency, she maintains, shows that he is still in the grip of the dichotomy of the transcendental and the empirical. Similarly, she argues, Foucault's understanding of power/knowledge vacillates between an “excessive essentialism” that makes it “a metaphysical entity” that has the “quasi-transcendental function” of determining all possible forms of knowledge (143) and an extreme nominalism that reduces truth to nothing more than that the very regime of power that it is supposed to constitute.

But even Han admits that these difficulties do not alter the fact that “the genealogical reinterpretation of the historical a priori is one of the most fertile elements in Foucault's work and that “genealogy itself turns out to be a powerful methodological tool” (145). Therefore, at a minimum, her objections have force only if we agree with her that genealogy requires a philosophical foundation. Why is such a foundation necessary, when, as Han admits, even without it genealogy remains an effective method of historical understanding? Insisting that Foucault provide the “theoretical foundation which [genealogy] needs philosophically” (145) leads Han to give strong philosophical weight to formulations that are more plausibly read as heuristic suggestions of how, in certain contexts, we can fruitfully think of truth than as strict philosophical definitions of the notion. Han simply assumes that Foucault must have a transcendental project in mind.

At first glance, Han's presentation of Foucault as in the grip of the transcendental problematic would seem most plausible for the final period of his work, in which he added to the axes of knowledge (archaeology) and power (genealogy) that of the individual subject, which “constitutes” itself in the context of the first two axes. But, of course, merely bringing into the discussion the individuals who are the subjects of knowledge and power hardly requires accepting a transcendental standpoint, which requires a very particular conception of the subject (that which Foucault denotes in The Order of Things as “man”). Han, however, maintains that Foucault's subject is a transcendental ego: “Foucault reactivates the perspective of a constitutive subjectivity and understands the constitution of the self by means of the atemporal structure of recognition” (187), a position that, as she notes, is obviously inconsistent with his earlier work, both archaeological and genealogical.

But why does Han insist that Foucault makes such an uncharacteristic move? Simply because he presents the subject as forming itself by a process of reflection and action, as, for example, when he says that thought (that whereby the subject gives itself a specific meaning) is “freedom in relation to what one does, the motion by which one detaches oneself from it, establishes it as an object, and reflects on it as a problem”.2 On Han's reading, such passages imply that Foucault's subject is “autonomous” (172), even in the radical sense of Sartrean existentialist humanism (169). She goes so far as to claim that Foucault's “insistence on the importance of problematization and recognition as voluntary and reflective activities leads him to envisage the relationship to the body in a purely unilateral manner, as an action of the self on the self, where the body only appears as material for transformation while consciousness seems to be paradoxically reinstalled in the sovereign position that genealogy had criticized” (165). This simply ignores the fact that freedom and reflection need not be read as the technical terms of idealist philosophy but may refer to everyday features of human life that are not radically autonomous but rather represent the small spark of subjectivity in a context heavily constrained by the social system of power-knowledge. In his books on ancient sexuality, Foucault of course often uses Platonic vocabulary, which smacks of strong autonomy. Moreover, since the power-knowledge constraints of ancient Greece and Rome are no longer relevant to us, he has little to say about them. He is simply looking for modes of thinking about the self (e.g., in terms of an aesthetics of existence) that might suggest strategies in our struggle with modern disciplinary society. None of this provides any grounds for concluding that Foucault has lapsed into transcendentalism.

Han's misreading of the late Foucault also derives from her difficulty in making sense of the notion of experience he deploys. This is understandable, given her focus on the brief and cryptic comments on experience in his Introduction to The Use of Pleasure. But she unfortunately ignores Foucault's detailed discussion of experience in other contexts; in particular, that of the philosophy of science. Here, among other things, Foucault makes it clear that the individual freedom Han reads as existentialist autonomy is rather rooted in the deviations (errors) of an organism acting in a strong field of bio-social forces.3

Han has an enviable knowledge of Foucault's texts and offers a valuable survey of what he has to say on the topic of transcendental philosophy. She also does a good job of showing the difficulties that confront efforts to construct a Foucaultian version of historicized transcendentalism. But her contention that these difficulties reflect unresolvable tensions in Foucault's own project remains unpersuasive. Her insistence on Foucault's transcendental project perhaps derives from her own conviction that such a project is philosophically unavoidable—a conviction on which Foucault's work in fact casts considerable doubt.


1. Hubert Dreyfus and Paul Rabinow, Michel Foucault: Beyond Structuralism and Hermeneutics, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2nd edition, 1983, 84.

2. Paul Rabinow (ed.), The Foucault Reader, New York: Pantheon, 1985, 388; cited, 165.

3. See Michel Foucault, "Life: Experience and Science", in Paul Rabinow (ed.), Essential Works of Foucault, Volume II, New York: The New Press, 1998, 465-78