Foucault's Heidegger: Philosophy and Transformative Experience

Placeholder book cover

Timothy Rayner, Foucault's Heidegger: Philosophy and Transformative Experience, Continuum, 2007, 166pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 0826494862.

Reviewed by C. G. Prado, Queen's University


In this pricey book, Timothy Rayner hypothesizes that Foucault acknowledges a debt to Heidegger "at precisely the same time as he came to understand philosophy as a self-transformative activity of thought," and that "Foucault appropriated, modified and began to articulate a quasi-Heideggerian transformative philosophical practice." (5, 35) The thrust is that it was only as Foucault's thought evolved to understanding philosophical thinking as transformative that he appreciated how much he owed Heidegger, about whom he previously had said little.

Rayner's treatment of Foucault puts him squarely among those I think of as Whiggish Foucauldians who read Foucault with two crucial presuppositions: that his thought was progressive throughout his career, and that Foucault's observations on the development of his own thought can be taken at face-value. (33-34, 35) I disagree with both presuppositions, thinking Foucault's "progress" was more a matter of shifts and changes, and finding the import of his comments on his own work as circumscribed by time, context, and especially mood. Rayner admits Foucault was "mercurial," but does not take seriously enough just how mercurial he was. (1) Rayner also quotes passages where Foucault extols the need to think differently, but reads them as aiming at advancement in thought. Against this, I think Foucault valued and sought difference in thought, not to progress intellectually in a way that could only be objective, but to escape intellectual normalization. With this card on the table, I will say what most struck me about the book.

Chapter 1, titled "Heidegger's Philosophical Practice," is central to what follows, its role being "to establish the Heideggerian practice at the heart of the argument." (6) Rayner presents Heidegger's work as "a three-part exercise and meditation that evolves from a phenomenological critique of subjectivity to a radical 'other' thinking through the experience of a turn in thinking." (6) The thrust of this is that Heidegger may be read as offering a transformative practice rather than what in contrast would be a categorical philosophy, that Foucault read him that way, and that his own philosophizing was thus determined in an essential manner.

My main concern about the book begins with Rayner's admonition that while "faithful to Heidegger's philosophy in all significant respects," the transformative-practice reading he offers and attributes to Foucault is "not intended as a description of how Heidegger understood his [own] work." (6) In this first chapter, then, we are looking at Heidegger twice removed. We are supposedly looking at Foucault's Heidegger, but of course the Heidegger presented as Foucault's is Rayner's Heidegger. Rayner admits that Chapters 2 through 4 are "an exercise in hypothetical interpretation," his aim being to present "an opportunity to think Foucault differently." (7) But speculation about how Foucault read Heidegger needs to be solidly grounded; the first chapter cannot be "an exercise in hypothetical interpretation." The account of Heidegger is the book's anchor, so it must not only be faithful to Heidegger's philosophy, it must be clearly and accessibly so, and I for one found it less than that. I admit that readers steeped in the Heideggerian discourse may well find it lucid, but the book's intended audience is not hard-core Heideggerians.

I was impressed with the first third of Chapter 1: Rayner's treatment of the difference between Being and beings. I do not think I have seen a clearer, more succinct explanation. However, the balance of the characterization of Heidegger's thought as the practice of transformational philosophizing is much less clear and convincing. The reason is not that Rayner makes interpretive mistakes; rather it is that his accounts of "transformational meditation" (20) and "other thinking" (28) slip into frustratingly elusive language. There is too much about organic folding and unfolding of conceptions and perspectives into their opposites or contraries. (At several points I had to put the book down for a bit and kept thinking of Wittgenstein's comment about language on holiday.) As a result, the reading of Heidegger that supposedly so influenced Foucault remains ill-defined.

In Chapter 2 Rayner presents an erudite and persuasive picture of the presence of Heideggerian ontological influence in Mental Illness and Psychology and The History of Madness. But things take a downturn when he plays down Foucault's reaction against that influence in the later The Order of Things. Foucault is presented as more emulator than originator, which may be fair enough with respect to the early Foucault, but not with respect to Foucault's rejection in The Order of Things of Heidegger's understanding of "the transition from Classicism to modernity" as continuous and his own presentation of it as discontinuous because of the objectification of language and reconception of representation. (48) Rayner, reiterating the essentialness of Heidegger to Foucault's thought, lessens the rejection by maintaining that Foucault was only "redressing" Heidegger's thought. (51) Foucault's rejection certainly looks like a break with Heidegger, and to describe it as a redressing seems tendentious with respect to maintaining the claimed essentialness of Heidegger to Foucault's thought. It also makes one wonder what Rayner would count as a decisive break, given that he disagrees with the widespread view "that there is a post-Heideggerian phase to Foucault's career." (37)

In the last part of Chapter 2 Rayner turns to Foucault's use of fiction, seeing it as important "that Foucault's archaeology of man and his paper on Blanchot and literature emerged in the same year." Rayner suggests that Foucault's interest in fiction was an attempt to "recuperate Heidegger's questioning practice," a suggestion he promises to substantiate in Chapter 3. (57) Unfortunately, much of Chapters 2 through 4 struck me as academic in the bad sense. What Rayner too often offers is a sometimes brilliant but irritatingly arcane discussion that I think Foucault would have been as impatient with as I was. It is the sort of discussion that does little more than provide fodder for recondite journal papers. As serious is that like the first chapter, the rest cast Foucault as an emulator: a kind of intellectual amalgam of Heideggerian transformational thought and Nietzschean historicist suspicion. The discussion also is marred by irksome language, notably Rayner's making "fiction" a verb as in "Foucault seeks to fiction true experience" (61) and repeatedly employing phrases like "quasi-Heideggerian" that become increasingly vague in proportion to their use. (E.g., 35, 37, 38, 41, 59, 61, 87, 119, 120)

But what about the content? The point of departure is a passage where Foucault says he has never written anything other than fiction. Rayner explains that "[w]hen Foucault claims that his books are fictions, he is thinking … of the kind of experience that these books make possible." (59, 60) I think this is right, and what Rayner seems to be getting at is what I label Foucault's "experiential use of truth" in my Starting with Foucault and Searle and Foucault on Truth. This is a use of "true" and "truth" that falls on the second side of Foucault's distinction between truth resulting from inquiry (l'enquête) and truth resulting from test or trial (l'épreuve), or the difference between what is learned through investigation and what is not so much learned as realized in a challenging experience. So far so good, but as Rayner focuses on truth, power, and fiction in the genealogical Foucault (71) the discussion drops to an introductory level, rather than remaining at a level for readers well-versed in Foucault and interested in his connection to Heidegger. Moreover, the emphasis on Foucault as emulator continues. Rayner paints Foucault's introduction of power as a matter of Heidegger and Nietzsche "really begin[ing] to communicate in his thought" and as Foucault "introducing a Nietzschean conception of power into his work." (73) Chapter 4, which at times seems to be more about Dreyfus than Foucault, does little to give Foucault his due as an original thinker.

The final chapter encapsulates Rayner's Whiggish reading of Foucault. The shift from genealogy to ethics is pictured as a culmination, and Foucault's remarks in his last interview are taken as an insightful and accurate assessment of his own progress. Rayner reads Foucault's belated admission that his work is philosophical as "a moment of closure and completion." (141)

One of the best theses I supervised was titled Foucault's Failure of Nerve: From Genealogy to Ethics. (Bronwyn Singleton, 1998) It argued that Foucault's shift from genealogy to ethics was a retreat from the bleakness of his vision of power and normalization. I think this is right,s that in his ethical thought Foucault rather anxiously strove to achieve what Rayner presents as much more gradually evolved aspirations. I do not see Foucault's last two books as capping a progressive development of thought; I see them as an attempt to reintroduce a measure of self-definition. As for what is of greatest value in Foucault's intellectual career, I agree with Rorty that "the most valuable part" of Foucault's work was showing how modern societies' "patterns of acculturation" have imposed on us "constraints of which older, premodern societies had not dreamed." (1989, Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity, 63) In the end, Rayner's Heideggerian Foucault is simply safer than the Nietzschean Foucault because emphasizing Heidegger blunts and obscures the nihilism inherent in his genealogical analytics.