Foucault's Legacy

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C. G. Prado (ed.), Foucault's Legacy, Continuum, 2009, 171pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781847065957.

Reviewed by Cressida J. Heyes, University of Alberta


The task of C. G. Prado's edited collection is to assess Foucault's legacy on the occasion of the 25th anniversary of his death. As the editor admits in the introduction, this is a vast task, circumscribed in the volume through eight articles that "examine [Foucault's] contributions to contemporary thought by entering into various different conversations with one of the most innovative, enigmatic, and challenging thinkers of our time" (3). This is a fairly generic description, and the articles are wide-ranging. Most are oriented around explicating Foucault's indebtedness to, and influence upon, various other philosophers -- Heidegger, Nietzsche, Hegel, Richard Rorty, Bernard Williams, Gianni Vattimo. As a result, we can read this volume as an analysis of Foucault's location in the ongoing history of ideas, as well as (in large part) an investigation of his relation to historicity and temporality and of his genealogical method. The essays progress more or less chronologically in terms of the interlocutors, from Nietzsche to Vattimo, bracketed by less directly figure-oriented essays on temporality and Foucault's relation to secularization and fascism.

Opening the volume, in "The temporality of power" David Couzens Hoy speculates that Foucault should be understood primarily as a thinker of temporality, since "temporality is the mode in which the processes of materiality run up against and are resisted by the processes of desubjectification" (10). Arguing that genealogy can be dialectical, he suggests that as a method it need not imply Hegelian universal history. Rather, he understands genealogy as providing a temporal frame that "construes materiality as the past, ideality as the present, and transformation as the future" (17). In a related essay, Tom Rockmore examines the French reception of Hegel as necessary background to understanding Foucault's critiques of humanism. Rockmore reads much of twentieth-century French philosophy as a revolt against Kojève's Hegelianism, with Foucault both participating in a more general turn against subjectivity and continuing a preoccupation with historicizing the conditions of possibility for its particular forms. In this latter sense, Rockmore concludes, Foucault's philosophical emphasis on historical understandings of (the) human being can be understood as a form of French Hegelianism, rather than only a reaction against it.

In "A philosophical shock: Foucault reading Nietzsche, reading Heidegger," Babette Babich argues that any reading of Foucault must incorporate readings of both Nietzsche and (a "very French") Heidegger, rather than one at the expense of the other. The meanders of this essay take us through Nietzsche and Heidegger via an analysis of The Birth of the Clinic and reflections on philosophy of science to make the case. Remaining with Heidegger, later in the volume Santiago Zabala examines Foucault's influence on the living Italian philosopher Vattimo. Foucault's implicitly Heideggerian ontology is made explicit in Vattimo's philosophy, Zabala argues. Foucault's "ontology of actuality" (or "historical ontology of ourselves") is his rejection of transcendental critique in favour of a historically situated analysis of the conditions of possibility of human being. This move, which engages Kant's legacy while rejecting key aspects of his thought, has been key for Vattimo. The latter's "weak thought" abandons "philosophy's traditional claim to global descriptions of the world because after those masters' demystifications … thought is much more aware of its own restrictions, limits, and boundaries" (115-116). Zabala goes on to make the connection between Vattimo's referencing of Foucault's ontology and Heidegger's destruction of metaphysics and his hermeneutic alternative.

All four of these essays (which are scattered through the volume) suffer from the same difficulty: no doubt the authors found it hard to compress such complex philosophical ideas and inheritances into a chapter-length essay, and they are all broad-ranging and allusive rather than focused on a closely argued issue.

Colin Koopman argues that Foucault's genealogical method evades the (allegedly) normative ambitions of its Nietzschean roots, and can thus be distinguished from Bernard Williams's contemporary use of genealogy in Truth and Truthfulness. For Williams (according to Koopman) "truth" is an analytic concept with inherent value, while "truthfulness" has a history and is embodied in diverse practices and is thus an appropriate object for genealogical critique. The critical reception of Williams's book has focused on the philosophical strength of the connection between these two claims, and while Koopman finds value in his defence of truth itself, he repeatedly questions whether a genealogy of truthfulness can escape the genetic fallacy and provide any implicit justification for a universal concept of truth. Foucault's genealogy, by contrast, focuses on identifying the historical emergence and evolution of our self-conceptions, and allows for self-reflexivity; it is an "analytical and diagnostic project" (105). Genealogy is thus the method of "problematization," and should not, in Foucault's case, be interpreted as normatively driven (or even crypto-normative). Koopman makes his argument clearly, but repetitively, and seems to get stuck at the claim (surely central to the essay's contribution) that genealogy can "be critically engaged in and broadly relevant to forms of inquiry involved in the normative evaluation of practices" (105). This key point is given short treatment and is not substantively linked back to the discussion of Williams, which thus appears solely as a foil; some discussion instead of Foucault's late remarks on parrhesia might have been useful here.

Also concerned with truth, Barry Allen's essay "After knowledge and liberty: Foucault and the new pragmatism," takes up the similarity in Foucault and Rorty's epistemological projects. According to Allen, Foucault rejects a normative concept of knowledge, accepting instead as truth anything that meets contingent discursive standards of credibility. This approach cannot provide normative justifications for the wrongs of disciplinary power, he claims -- a lack to which Rorty the pragmatist draws attention. Rorty's criticisms of Foucault, as represented by Allen, now feel rather overworked and dated (Foucault refuses normative claims, refuses to invoke a community with interests worth defending, his work doesn't have the positive effects that liberal politics does, etc.). Between allusions to Foucault and Rorty's own work, Rorty's critique of Foucault, and general points about liberalism, it's hard to find the author's own position in this essay, although he concludes with important reference to Foucault's increasing significance in criticizing the neoliberal security state.

The last two essays of the eight take up Foucault's relation to fascism and Christianity. First, in his useful chapter "Foucault, secularization theory, and the theological origins of totalitarianism," Michael Lackey argues that Nazi fascism cannot be understood, on Foucault's view, "without taking into account the crucial role Christianity played in the formation of the Western political subject and the modern nation-state" (125). Lackey's reading of Foucault challenges the orthodoxy according to which "secularization was a precondition for the emergence of the nation-state, totalitarianism, and fascism" (125). Rather, on Lackey's interpretation, the modern secular subject is deeply Christian, where this does not imply religious practice or belief but rather an implicitly theological worldview -- in particular, an authoritarian technology of the self. The confessional model of self-knowledge, combined with a belief in God-authored truth and the denunciation of those who do not acknowledge it, creates a "hierarchical model of knowledge that created the conditions for fascism to flourish" (132). Lackey goes on to read Hitler's own writing and speeches to apply this model to the most famous fascist, concluding that Christianity's ability to create a depth in the self that it then controls has proved an invaluable technology for authoritarian and dogmatic politics. (This thesis is convincingly articulated, but Hitler's own words hardly seem worth the care that Lackey applies to their reading; I'd like to see the same ideas applied to the contemporary US for a more powerful example -- see James Bernauer's note 40 for an aside to just such an application.)

Bernauer's excellent article, "Secular self-sacrifice: on Michel Foucault's courses at the Collège de France" takes up a very similar thesis and completes the volume. Drawing on his reading of Foucault's more recently translated and less well discussed lectures, as well as biographical information, Bernauer suggests that Foucault's analysis of Christianity's subjective depth has political implications. Confession, penance, and the pastorate are all institutions that have consequences for the individual's relation to his own truth as well as for his obedience to a higher authority. That these technologies of self and other have become detached from overt religiosity only makes them more insidious, and Bernauer draws on some interesting textual examples from the lectures to illustrate Foucault's critique of Christian secularism. He concludes provocatively with the suggestion that Foucault's increasingly personal approach to his work -- moving from the death of the author to care of the self -- might be primarily motivated by a desire to evade the normalized anonymity of living and dying in an age of "totalized meaningfulness" (157).

The volume closes with a useful short bibliography that complements the copious footnotes to the individual essays, as well as an index. As a whole the book has its weaknesses: some essays contain potted summaries of vast themes and literatures (Allen takes six pages to summarize "knowledge after Nietzsche" via Heidegger and Habermas to Foucault, for example, while Babich's roaming essay mentions just about every philosopher after Nietzsche without dwelling on any one). Several of the authors are recapitulating quite directly material that appears in earlier books: Couzens Hoy's Time of Our Lives, Allen's Knowledge and Civilization, and Rockmore's corpus on Hegel, for example. More thorough copy-editing might have reduced the amount of repetition in several of the essays, and a fuller introduction setting the scene, linking the chapters, and previewing their contributions would have been welcome. Nonetheless, these essays are quite consistent in method and tone, examining Foucault's relation to figures and ideas in continental philosophy, and this volume will be especially useful to readers in the Anglo-American traditions looking to deepen their understanding of Foucault's intellectual context. The essays on political themes as well as mention of pragmatism and discussion of tradition-crossing figures such as Rorty and Williams will also give the book a larger audience. Most of all, this collection represents, as it set out to do, Foucault's location in intellectual history and the broad and eclectic impact of his thought a quarter century after his death.