Foucault's Philosophy of Art: A Genealogy of Modernity

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Joseph J. Tanke, Foucault's Philosophy of Art: A Genealogy of Modernity, Continuum, 2009, 222pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781847064851.

Reviewed by Lynne Huffer, Emory University



Foucault’s Philosophy of Art presents a wide-ranging overview of Foucault’s various writings about Western art. The book explores “how art sheds its traditional vocation in order to become modern” (5) through a systematic analysis of Foucault’s claims about the post-representational nature of modern art. Weaving together Foucault’s disparate writings, interviews, and lectures on visual aesthetics — some of them only recently published and still untranslated - Tanke finds in Foucault not only a “philosophy of art,” as announced by the book’s title, but also a “lost genealogy” and a new “strand in the historical ontology of ourselves” (4). Tanke situates Foucault’s art writings in the interstitial space that separates aesthetic philosophy from art history. So doing, he allows formal problems such as materiality, medium, lighting, color, depth, perspective, similitude, abstraction, and the place of the viewer to interface with familiar Foucauldian concepts such as archeological description, genealogical rupture, the event, ethical parrhesia, and the shifting relation between subjectivity and truth. Tanke presents Foucault’s writings on art as a “necessary corrective to the ahistorical tendencies of philosophical aesthetics” (5). At the same time, the Foucauldian philosophical apparatus Tanke brings to bear on aesthetic criticism reshapes our understanding of art history. Reframing genealogy as a “visual practice” (6) that articulates a “dissociating view” (7), Tanke thus rewrites both the story of Foucault and the story of modern art. If we have long understood Foucault to be a thinker of epistemic and genealogical rupture, the relation between that rupture and the visual realm has not yet been as clearly articulated as it is in Foucault’s Philosophy of Art.



Although Tanke claims to present Foucault’s writings on art from the 17th century to the present, the book is primarily about modernity and Foucault’s analyses of modern artists, including his 1971 Tunis lecture on Edouard Manet (1832-1883), his book on René Magritte (1898-1967), and lesser known writings and interviews on Paul Rebeyrolle (1926-2005), Paul Klee (1879-1940), Vasily Kandinsky (1866-1944), Andy Warhol (1928-1987), Gérard Fromanger (b. 1939), Werner Schroeter (b. 1945), and Duane Michals (b. 1932). Tanke bookends his readings of art in modernity with an opening interpretation of Foucault’s famous commentary on Diego Velázquez’s Las Meninas (1656) in The Order of Things (1966) and, in the final chapter, an analysis of Foucault’s last Collège de France lectures, Le Courage de la vérité, on the Cynical life as a work of art. Throughout the book, Tanke develops the Foucauldian claim that, beginning with Manet in the mid-19th century, art establishes a break with quattrocento painting by moving away from a representational aesthetic. “When we take a genealogical look at Western art,” Tanke writes, “we see that modernity is fundamentally incompatible with representation” (8).



To be sure, to say that modern art is post-representational is hardly a new insight. Indeed, the bulk of 20th-century writing on art, from R. G. Collingwood to Clement Greenberg to Rosalind Krauss to Gary Shapiro’s study of visuality in Foucault and Nietzsche,1 can be viewed as an elaboration on the post-representation theme. One might therefore be tempted, at first glance, to dismiss Tanke’s thesis as unoriginal. Such a reading, however, would miss the uniquely archeological frame Tanke brings to his analysis. As Tanke points out, and as readers of Foucault’s The Order of Things (1966) already know, “representation” in Foucault has a specific, historically inflected epistemic meaning: representation names the ordering of knowledge that characterizes the Classical age, the 17th and 18th-century episteme that follows the Renaissance age of resemblance and which gives way to modernity and the rise of man at the end of the 18th century. Understanding this archeological sense of representation is crucial to comprehending Tanke’s thesis about post-representational art, and Tanke helpfully devotes the book’s first chapter, “The Stirrings of Modernity,” to a clear explication of The Order of Things and the significance of art in the story it tells.



The analysis in Tanke’s first chapter lays the foundation for his elaboration of the post-representation thesis in the rest of the book. Let me focus on two conceptual problems that emerge there. First, what is the historico-philosophical relation between resemblance and representation? Second, what is the relation between art and knowledge, especially in the post-representational age? Examining these questions in some detail allows me to engage broader questions about the value of Tanke’s approach to Foucault’s aesthetic writings, including the book’s investment in linking Foucault’s writings about art to ethical claims about aesthetic freedom.


On the first point: what is the relation between resemblance and representation? The epistemic shift from Renaissance resemblance to Classical representation in The Order of Things highlights a fraught relation between resemblance and representation that will appear repeatedly over the course of Tanke’s study: from the self-referential materiality of Manet’s tableaux-objets (Chapter Two) to the non-referential similitudes found in the visual-linguistic paintings of Magritte, Klee, and Kandinsky (Chapter Three) to the self-replicating release of the image in Warhol’s Campbell soup cans, Fromanger’s tableaux-events, or Michals’s serial photographic narratives (Chapter Three) to the Cynical “anti-Platonism of modern art” (182) as an ethics of living (Chapter Five). These permutations of the resemblance-representation theme originate in the Las Meninas chapter, where Tanke rehearses Foucault’s description of the relation between the Renaissance and Classical epistemes. Briefly, if the Renaissance ordering of knowledge as hidden resemblances gives way to a Classical system of representation based on the taxonomic ordering of visible signs, resemblance persists beyond the Renaissance episteme in the work of poets and artists. Tanke writes, following Foucault: "the poet and the painter are the untimely ones who continue to view the world through the eyes of resemblance" (34, emphasis added), disrupting the reigning order of knowledge and “opening up new trajectories of thought” (36).



Given the importance of the resemblance theme in the 20th-century artists under review in the book, it is worth pausing over this Foucauldian point and raising some questions for Tanke about the disruptive force of the art he describes. Is the untimeliness of poets and painters a transhistorical characteristic of artistic practice generally or a feature particular to the Renaissance and Classical orders? More pointedly, if resemblance persists beyond the Renaissance through the work of visual artists, does this incommensurability between artistic practice (as resemblance) and the order of knowledge (as representation) carry through into the modern age? As I’ve already suggested with the examples of artists mentioned above, some form of resemblance seems to linger, infiltrating not only the Classical period but also the modern order. Indeed, Tanke makes this persistence of resemblance explicit: "Las Meninas … contains some of the values associated with the Renaissance experience of the world, one that haunts the Western imagination throughout modernity" (16).



Less explicit in Tanke’s analysis is how the parallel relations between art-as-resemblance and knowledge-as-representation become reconfigured beyond the Classical age of representation. How, exactly, does the Renaissance haunting of resemblance occur in the modern age? More problematically, what is the relation between this persistence of resemblance and the break with quattrocento painting, ushered in by Manet (Chapter Two), that marks the advent of non-representational modernity? Is pre-representational Renaissance resemblance of the same order as modern post-representation? As we have seen, Tanke’s insistence on the persistence of resemblance in the Velázquez chapter implies a continuity that links the Renaissance order and the modern forms of similitude he analyzes in later chapters. At the same time, and somewhat contradictorily, the book’s non-representational thesis rests on the repeated assertion of a definitive break with a Renaissance and Classical representational order, defined through the pictorial conventions — depth, perspective, and the illusion of non-materiality — associated with quattrocento painting.



This brings me to the second guiding conceptual question about the relation between art and knowledge in the age of post-representation. As we follow Tanke’s analysis of Velázquez into the age of man, the first set of questions about art-as-resemblance and knowledge-as-representation becomes more pressing. Like the poets and painters mentioned earlier, Las Meninas is “untimely” (16), belonging simultaneously to all three epistemes in The Order of Things. Created in the heart of the 17th century, it simultaneously reflects a premodern experience of resemblance, a Classical order of representation, and a post-representational age of man. Given this untimeliness, Tanke makes much of the shifting place of the viewer/painter in a Classical painting we can only interpret from the unstable perspective of our own historical present. In Las Meninas, the viewer “transforms into a doublet” (45): the same “strange empirico-transcendental doublet”2 called “man” who emerges in modernity as the “paradoxical figure” (OT 322) of Foucault’s analytic of finitude.



Something odd happens here in Tanke’s study regarding the relation between art and knowledge after the toppling of representation. If, as we have seen with “the untimely ones,” art-as-resemblance and knowledge-as-representation are incommensurable in the Classical age, here, at the threshold of modernity, art and knowledge seem to converge as post-representation. Tanke makes this point explicit:

With man’s arrival on the scene of Western knowledge, painting itself embodies the positivities that characterize the modern episteme… . Painting, starting with Manet, ceases to concern itself with its traditional representational task, instead undertaking the interrogation of its own finitude in much the same way as the sciences of man (50).

This difference between the Classical divergence and modern convergence of art and knowledge is crucial for at least two reasons.


First, it exposes basic contradictions in Tanke’s (and perhaps Foucault’s) historiographical frame. Tanke simultaneously argues for the persistence of the Renaissance (as resemblance) and a break with it (as quattrocento painting) in modern art. How is this so? To be sure, Foucault is a thinker of paradox, and it is entirely possible that these contradictory assertions might be explained within a paradigm that embraces paradox. Tanke briefly acknowledges that Foucault’s genealogical account of modern art “tends to conflate” (17) the Renaissance and Classical periods. But such an acknowledgement does not explain the conceptual problems generated by that conflation. Lacking any such explanation by Tanke (or even an acknowledgement that the resemblance-representation contradiction exists), one is left wondering what to make of it.



Second, the divergence versus convergence of art and knowledge raises important philosophical questions. If art’s capacity to “transgress” (a term Tanke uses repeatedly) has something to do with its untimeliness — its temporal out-of-syncness with the epistemic ordering of its own time — how are we to understand the post-representational convergence of art and knowledge so clearly asserted at the end of the Las Meninas chapter? Has art in modernity become timely? Clearly not, since Tanke repeatedly characterizes modern art as a rupturing force in the present. But how is this so if the epistemic and aesthetic orders so clearly converge in post-representation? If, as Tanke asserts early in the book, Foucault “understood art as an anticultural force” (4), how are we to conceptualize the temporality of that force?



Let me offer two examples to illustrate the stakes of this second question. According to Tanke (and Foucault), the distorting mirror in Manet’s Le Bar aux Folies-Bergère (1881-1882) destabilizes and mobilizes the viewer’s position in contrast to quattrocento painting’s orthogonal fixing of the viewer. Fair enough. But what are we to make of the genealogical rupture this implies? It would seem, following the Velázquez chapter and the post-representational art-knowledge convergence described above, that this artistic rupture parallels an epistemic break at the end of the Classical age. But if that is the case, how are we then to understand the subsequent ruptures and transgressive practices Tanke details over the course of the 20th century? Tanke’s art-as-transgression theme seems to imply, once again, a divergent relation between art and knowledge, despite the post-representation convergence thesis. Another example illustrates this point, in this case as an anti-psychological artistic practice at odds with a psychological ordering of knowledge. Specifically, Tanke argues that Duane Michals’s photographic images eliminate psychological depth (151, 155) and “restore a freedom to seeing, thinking, and feeling” (160) through the evocation of “timeless thought-emotions” (160). How can we explain these anti-psychological, transgressive moves in the face of the post-representation convergence thesis that would imply an art-knowledge parallel in the psychologization of the modern subject?



To be fair, Foucault himself is unclear about these matters, both in The Order of Things and in his subsequent writings about art. For example, if Foucault is explicit in The Order of Things about the “strangeness” (OT 50) of artistic similitude in the Classical order of knowledge, he does not explain what happens to art in its relation to knowledge in the age of man. Shapiro began to address some of these issues in his chapters on Foucault and postmodern similitude. Tanke’s attempt to fill out the picture even further is informative and provocative, even if it raises some of the nagging questions I’ve detailed above. Tanke might well respond to both my questions about what is at stake in the modernity of art by repeating what he asserts in the book: for Foucault, the temporal epoch we call modernity is not only a chronological concept but also "an ethos or attitude: it is a relationship with one’s present that allows for that present to be punctured, rendered alien, and subject to philosophical analysis" (2). Indeed, Tanke reminds his readers of Foucault’s own misgivings about the term “modernity,” quoting Foucault in a 1983 interview: “I’ve never clearly understood what was meant in France by the word ‘modernity’” (13). But if we agree with Tanke that modernity is more an ethos than an epoch, one still needs to reconcile that assertion with Tanke’s chronological description of modern art as a definitive break with quattrocento painting. More importantly, if what looks like an epoch is actually an ethos, one still needs to account for historical singularity: the Foucauldian claim, taken up by Tanke, that history unfolds through the temporal emergence of events in their singularity. As Foucault puts it in The Archeology of Knowledge (1969), the archeological question remains: “what is this singular existence that comes to light in what is said” — or in the case of art, in what is painted, photographed, or filmed — “and nowhere else?”3



These unresolved tensions bring me to my final question about ethics. Especially in Chapters Four and Five, Tanke links Foucault’s thinking about aesthetics to his later work on the ethical formation of the subject. Tanke finds in Foucault’s celebration of post-representational simulacra and the “irreality of images” (11) they generate a refusal of Platonism’s “archaic morality” (10) and its imagistic mimesis of absolute truth. For Tanke, there is ethical value in the release of image-events he finds in the modern works under investigation. Schroeter’s films, for example, make “images pass” and are “thus ethical” (150). Along similar lines, Michals’s photographic sequences disrupt morality by reversing “the ocular ethic of photography” (156). Fromanger’s "photogenic dispositifs" (136) use painting as a “sling-shot of images” (145) to release rather than capture events. And Cynicism’s performative parrhesia as visual truth functions as a “transhistorical ethical category” (177) to transform modern life itself into a work of art (194). Tanke does not explicitly say what he means by ethics, but drawing on the claims just enumerated — art as rupture, release, liberation, or reversal — we can piece together what we might call an anti-normative ethics of freedom in the practices of the artistic subject.



But what is this freedom exactly and how does it interface, as art, with the epistemic, moral, and political constraints of history so clearly described in Foucault’s famous works, from History of Madness to Discipline and Punish to The History of Sexuality? Tanke repeatedly describes this freedom as a force unearthed in history: Rebeyrolle’s canvasses “dig into painting’s representative capacity to unearth a play of forces” (90); similarly, Michals “overturns the conventions of photography by reaching into history to unearth alternative strategies” (153); and Foucault himself, in his lectures on the Cynics, “unearths an alternative path out of the ancient period” (169). Linking the Cynics to Manet’s “rupture,” Tanke writes: “The key word in the 1984 course [on the Cynics] is eruption. The ‘eruption’ of the elementary is the means by which art establishes a polemical role with previous artistic conventions and the complacency of culture” (182). Forces, strategies, paths, the elementary: these unearthed energies seem to explode into the present as the timeless eruptions of freedom itself. And while this transhistorical view of art as a disruptive élan may appeal to some, it is not consistent with Foucault’s own thinking about power as the productive play of forces or freedom as a relational practice: “the freedom of the subject in relation to others … constitutes the very stuff of ethics.”4 This transhistorical view of artistic rupture also seems at odds with Tanke’s own desire to offer a corrective to the ahistoricism of philosophical aesthetics.



I pose these questions about Tanke’s claims in the spirit of engagement and with genuine admiration for the book’s contribution to Foucault studies, philosophical aesthetics, and art history. As I stated earlier, many of these conundrums in Foucault’s writings about art grow out of issues he himself never resolved. And because Foucault’s attention to art is less sustained than his exploration of other matters — madness, the human sciences, punishment, sexuality — the tension between Foucault’s unflinching insistence on historical singularity and certain transhistorical claims in his work becomes even more difficult to resolve. To quote the title of a 1973 Michals photograph, when it comes to Foucault and aesthetics, “things are queer.” Whether or not it all adds up to “Foucault’s philosophy of art,” as Tanke’s title claims, is a question I hope we can continue to debate.









1 Gary Shapiro, Archeologies of Vision: Foucault and Nietzsche on Seeing and Saying (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2003).



2 Michel Foucault, The Order of Things: An Archeology of the Human Sciences (New York: Vintage, 1970), p. 318.



3 Michel Foucault, The Archeology of Knowledge, trans. A. M. Sheridan Smith (New York: Pantheon, 1972), p. 29; L’archéologie du savoir (Paris: Gallimard, 1969), p. 28, translation modified.



4 Michel Foucault, “The Ethics of the Concern for Self as a Practice of Freedom,” in Ethics: Subjectivity and Truth, ed. Paul Rabinow (New York: New Press, 1994), p. 300.