Foucault/Derrida Fifty Years Later: The Futures of Genealogy, Deconstruction, and Politics

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Olivia Custer, Penelope Deutscher, and Samir Haddad (eds.), Foucault/Derrida Fifty Years Later: The Futures of Genealogy, Deconstruction, and Politics, Columbia University Press, 2016, 234pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231171953.

Reviewed by Christopher Penfield, Sweet Briar College


The 'debate' between Michel Foucault and Jacques Derrida on the history of reason's exclusion of madness is famous for the polemical charge, rhetorical force, and intellectual acuity it displays. Less well-known are the debate's philosophical stakes, not only for the careers of Derrida and Foucault, but for the legacy of their competing methodologies for critical thought today. The aim of Olivia Custer, Penelope Deutscher, and Samir Haddad's edited volume is precisely to plumb and cultivate the critical philosophic wealth of a debate the dimensions of which have, until recently, gone all-too-untended.

In their instructive introduction, the editors characterize the work as a "double project": (1) to "make accessible both the core texts and the central problems of the debate"; and (2) to "propose differing ways to understand the impetus it gives to future research" (xv). In the service of the first aspect, the volume seeks to establish "an extended archive" (xvii) for the debate, going beyond the three main sources -- Foucault's History of Madness; Derrida's "Cogito and the History of Madness"; and Foucault's well-known response, "My Body, This Paper, This Fire" -- to include additional texts bearing directly on the exchange or indirectly showing the philosophical ramifications of this debate in both thinkers' subsequent works. The well-executed goal is thus to expand the scope of the debate while expounding and sharpening its philosophical significance.

With respect to this significance, and as a way of realizing the second aspect of the project, the editors emphasize the implications of the Derrida-Foucault debate for contemporary "critical practice": the "problem" that is "central to this volume" is how to develop "transcendental methods that contend with the fact that the transcendental cannot be free of the empirical" (xvii). In other words, what is the critical purchase and agential possibility of thought's interrogation into (its own) constitutive conditions, if and when these conditions are themselves conceived as historically contingent?

As I read the book, this central philosophical problem is posed, treated, and contested in greatest detail throughout the first half. This material will therefore be my focus here. In Part One, "Openings," comprised of three essays, we are first introduced by Pierre Macherey to the competing "conceptions of the philosophical method" (13) at stake in the debate, the crux of which concerns the nature of the relation between madness and reason. Whereas Foucault posits an inner-outer division between reason and madness, Derrida articulates a more complicated enfolding of their relation, of a madness both repudiated and assimilated at the heart of reason. And while Foucault charges Derrida with foreclosing that which, radically exterior to reason, would introduce contingency into the latter's foundations, Derrida, on Macherey's view, "would have refused as logocentric, logocratic, perhaps even phallogocratic, any neat separation, be it by means of history, between the inside and the outside" (20).

Lynne Huffer provides a much needed and convincing corrective to the Derridean view that Foucault tried in History of Madness to write the history of 'madness itself.' For Huffer, the "real task" (3) confronting Foucault's archaeological project is to show how madness has been constituted in relation to what Foucault calls a "historical ensemble" comprised of "notions, institutions, juridical and political measures, scientific concepts"[1] -- which is why he writes in the original preface that "the most important part of this work is the space I have left to the texts of the archives themselves."[2] Contra Derrida, then, it is not the voice(s) of madness itself, but of the 'archives themselves', that Foucault's work aims to let speak: not the savage purity of an experience before it has been captured as an object of knowledge by reason, but the patient labor of excavating and reconstructing all the archival traces, practices and discourses attesting to the "quiet, faceless, administrative violence" (35) by which madness has been excluded, treated, and produced. Madness can thus be understood as a proto-genealogical account of psychiatric power-knowledge.

Taking up a strong defense of Derrida, Michael Naas explores the resonances of the debate in Derrida's death penalty seminars. The sovereign decision to condemn to death is the analogue in politics to the miracle in theology, "a decision or an event that itself is not subject to calculation" (41). The death penalty enacts the decision that life and death are calculable; and there could be no additional calculation that would justify this decision, since it is the decision itself that makes calculation as such possible: "a hyperbolic moment," "something absolutely heterogeneous to the calculable that nonetheless functions as the ground of the calculable itself" (42). Naas then rereads "Cogito" in light of this hyperbolic structure. If the history of western culture is the history of reason, it is not that of "Latin rationality" but rather, quoting Derrida, of "a Grund that is also an Ab-Grund": a foundation that is also an abyss; a ground that is itself groundless; a reason that "justifies everything" but cannot itself be justified, thus acting as a kind of un-reason (45).

On Naas's reading of Derrida, reason as such is possessed of this hyperbolic structure, a self-founding leap that "is indistinguishable, in the end, from a certain madness" (46). Indeed, this is why Derrida emphasizes the 'hyperbolic moment' at the end of Descartes's First Meditation when the cogito, stupefied by the thought of the evil genius, is brought "to the point where absolutely nothing is left untouched by doubt, the point where reason is indistinguishable from madness" (48-9). Although it thus "precedes or exceeds the separation of meaning and nonmeaning" (49), the zero point of the cogito, the dazzling immediacy of the 'I think' in the face of radical doubt, is what makes any meaningful project, work, or history possible. To reduce it to a specific historical structure, as Derrida charges Foucault of doing, carries two disastrous consequences: (1) Foucault cannot interrogate the ground of possibility for his own discourse, since it is not clear how any meaning (including his own) could be possible that would not be merely determined by a historico-social formation; (2) Foucault thereby succumbs to historicism, perpetrating "a violence toward the transcendental" that "attempt[s] to reduce the moment of hyperbole to history" (57).

Naas thus hits upon a fundamental question of the debate, namely, "the question . . . of reason in relation to history or historicity" (58), that is, of thought's irreducibility to structural-historical determination. However, Naas also concedes that the parallel he draws between "the hyperbolic moment" in "Cogito," on the one hand, and "the moment of a seemingly sovereign decision" in the death penalty seminars, on the other, "may look somewhat arbitrary or forced. But," he continues, "already in that earlier essay, the point of departure is explicitly and insistently thought in terms of decision" (50). Now, what Naas does not seem to consider is that this language of decision permeating "Cogito" in fact comes to us by way of Foucault's original preface. There, the "primitive decision" "through which a culture rejects something which for it will be the Exterior"[3] functions as a constitutive division founding and splitting the history of reason in the West. Foucault's project thus aims to "go back to that decision that both bound and separated reason and madness" so as to discover "the originary confrontation that gives meaning to the unity and the opposition of sense and senselessness. That will allow that lightning flash decision to appear once more, heterogeneous with the time of history, but ungraspable outside it."[4]

This passage suggests two immediate consequences for Naas's essay. First, it renders dubious the charge that Foucault commits the totalizing violence of historicist closure by failing to "ask certain transcendental or transcendentalizing questions" (57), since what is at issue is precisely the hyperbolic structure of a groundless ground, of a basis for justification that can never itself be justified. Indeed, the thesis of "an ineradicable originary violence" (58) underlying reason, attributed by Naas to Derrida, is precisely Foucault's. Second, and accordingly, the excellent analysis that Naas provides of Derrida's death penalty seminars might, in fact, be fruitfully applied to Foucault's project, since the fulgurant decision that Foucault describes as 'heterogeneous with the time of history' (while yet making the latter possible) evinces precisely the structure of the hyperbolic moment. Indeed, Derrida's death penalty seminars might even be construed as a re-thinking of what is at stake in Foucault's original preface, bespeaking the echoes of the debate four decades later.

The three essays comprising Part Two, "Surviving the Philosophical Problem: History Crosses Transcendental Analysis," provide a robust, interestingly resonant and dissonant treatment of the debate's metaphilosophical stakes and implications for critical thought today. Colin Koopman frames the matter as a conflict between how each thinker relates his own work to philosophy. Aptly making use of Foucault's chronically under-read "Reply to Derrida," Koopman argues that the debate can be cast in terms of the degree of indispensability accorded to philosophy itself, that is, whether or not philosophy is obligatory for thought. Whereas Derrida, on Foucault's view, privileges philosophy as the arbiter of meaningful discourse (insofar as a discourse secures its rational warrant by establishing its philosophical ground), for Foucault, philosophical discourse itself is subject to historical conditions of enunciation, the archival conditions for the formation of statements proper to a given episteme. As Koopman puts it: "If for Derrida philosophy was the form that thought would take whenever it interrogates its own conditions, for Foucault philosophy is itself subject to rules of formation" (69).

However, Foucault would likely agree with the characterization of philosophy as thought reflecting upon its own conditions, for this is precisely how he describes the tradition of critical philosophy in which he situates himself.[5] The real issue would thus seem to be the nature of the conditions to which thought is subject. Are these conditions themselves transhistorical, necessary and universal, and to what extent; or, on the contrary, can they be understood as historically contingent and singular 'all the way down'? Indeed, Koopman casts the philosophical problem in similar terms at the end of his essay. Deconstruction and genealogy can each be understood as a philosophy of the limit, a critical reflection of thought upon the limit-conditions proper to it. But "Derrida deconstructively shows us that our most necessary limits are also contingent, whereas Foucault genealogically shows us how that which is contingent has come to be taken as necessary. . . . It is only the latter that can be of use in the practical task of remaking what history has given us to be" (77). At stake in a methodological difference between competing forms of critical philosophy is thus the very question of thought's transformative agency.

Thomas Khurana begins, in a sense, where Koopman concludes: Foucault and Derrida are both committed to "the transformation of the transcendental question," (80) and whatever their divergences, a shared question guides their respective projects: "how to renew the project of critique" (97). Contra Koopman, Khurana defends Derrida against the charge of "merely reaffirming the foundational claim of philosophy and . . . insisting on transcendental questions of the canonical sort," but contra Macherey and Naas, he defends Foucault against the charges of naïve positivism and historicism (81). Khurana's objective, then, is to complicate and add nuance to our understanding of the critical philosophies of both Derrida and Foucault, tracing "a deeper methodological affinity" (95) between them.

At issue once again is how to understand the conditions of possibility for thought. The bulk of Khurana's essay provides a detailed, convincing, and illuminating account of Derrida's manner of answering this question, which can be analyzed into two distinct though related projects: "a project of quasi-transcendental accounting," which "works to show that the conditions of possibility of a certain type of act or capacity are simultaneously the conditions of impossibility of its purity"; and "a project of ultratranscendental questioning," inquiring into the relation between the empirical and the transcendental that makes the first kind of project (quasi-transcendental accounting) possible (86).

Khurana then aims to show how both projects are operative in Derrida's critique of Foucault as well as how both have analogues in Foucault's own archaeological project. In our discussion of Naas's essay above, we have seen, in effect, how Foucault's Madness can be understood as a kind of quasi-transcendental accounting; for the conditions of possibility for reason (constitutive division) are also the conditions of impossibility for its purity. Less convincing, in my view, is Khurana's attempt to establish an affinity between Foucault and Derrida at the level of 'ultratranscendental questioning.' Khurana insists that for Derrida, "the transcendental condition is irreducibly related to the empirical level" because transcendental conditions are only ever accessed through, and actualized within, empirical experiences (88). But the crucial question is whether the conditions of possibility are themselves historically contingent (hence mutable), or whether they are to be conceived as transhistorical, universal, or necessary.

Now, in Khurana's discussion of Foucault's concept of the historical a priori (the set of "condition[s] of reality for statements"[6] proper to a given epistemic formation), he emphasizes that these conditions are "historical in a double sense," "both constitutive conditions of history and themselves subject to history" (93-4). In other words, the conditions that constitute history are themselves acted upon and transformed by history: conditions, then, are conditioned by what they condition. Khurana observes that Foucault thereby "complicate[s] a clear-cut division between the empirical and the transcendental" (94), but the implications would seem to go further. If it is an essential feature of "the transcendental tradition" that "in order for a condition to be really able to ground and make possible the conditioned, it has to be qualitatively heterogeneous from what it conditions" (90) -- a membership criterion, incidentally, that might well exclude Deleuze's transcendental empiricism -- then on Khurana's own account, and by contrast to Derrida, it is not at all clear that Foucault can be situated within the tradition of transcendental philosophy. For if the conditions of history can themselves be transformed by the very history they constitute, then the condition would not seem to be qualitatively heterogeneous from the conditioned.

Part Two closes with Amy Allen's articulation and defense of Foucault's form of critical philosophy as an immanent critique of reason, opposing it to the critical methodologies of Derrida and Habermas. Allen aligns these latter philosophers of transcendence on the basis of three assumptions they share regarding Foucault's Madness: (1) that Foucault is attempting a 'radical critique of,' or 'revolution against,' reason; (2) that such a project, insofar as it is a project, that is, a (rational) work, is performatively self-contradictory; and (3) that Foucault's only way out would be a romantic gesture of escape, an ultimately metaphysical recourse to what would be "the radical outside to reason" (113). Allen then convincingly argues that the explanation for this convergent set of assumptions between Habermas and Derrida is their common investment in "the transcendence of reason, namely that reason is characterized by what Derrida calls its unsurpassability, uniqueness, and imperial grandeur, or that it carries within it a moment of what Habermas calls 'unconditionality' that is the 'transcendent moment of universal validity'" (113). By contrast, on Allen's view, Foucault "explicitly rejects the idea of a transcendent reason, of Reason as such" (115), providing instead "an immanent critique of the historically specific forms of rationality that are for us indispensable but also dangerous" (116). Foucault would thus have no need to escape reason in order to critique it. Rather, like the emplacement of genealogical perspectivism, his "methodology is that of a participant-observer" whose goal "is to make strange our form of rationality or our historical a priori, so that we can open up a critical distance between ourselves and the historical a priori within which we are constituted as rational subjects" (117).

Allen makes clear that "what is at stake is a fundamental methodological disagreement about how to do critical philosophy" (106). However, from the other side of this disagreement, it is less certain that her defense of immanent critique would satisfy concerns about the threat historicist reduction poses to critical thought's agency. While I agree that Foucault rejects a transcendent concept of reason, other Foucauldian resources could be marshalled here to provide an immanent functional equivalent to transcendent unconditionality, helping to dispel the worry about historicism. For example, in a 1984 essay on methodology, Foucault articulates "the principle of irreducibility of thought": whatever the role played in any given experience by formal transcendental conditions ("universal structures") and constitutive historico-social conditions ("the concrete determinations of social existence"), "neither those determinations nor those structures can allow for experiences . . . except through thought."[7] Thought thus designates that ineliminable aspect of experience which cannot be explained by any kind of social or historical determinism. Or, as Foucault puts it more positively in an interview from the same year: "Thought is freedom in relation to what one does, the motion by which one detaches oneself from it, establishes it as an object, and reflects on it as a problem."[8] If Foucault needs no recourse to transcendent reason, this is because the agency of thought is secured through his conception of immanent critique (thought working upon itself) as the practice of freedom. Allen's conclusion is thus re-confirmed, but in a way that may more directly respond to the question of historicist closure.

Parts Three, Four, and Five, in turn, pursue the reverberations of the debate throughout the oeuvres of both Derrida and Foucault, sketching intriguing directions for future scholarship. In Part Three, "After-Effects," Judith Revel posits a Derrida-effect in Foucault's reorientation, following the mid-1960s, toward a history or "philosophical problematization" (131) of the present; and Haddad, deflecting Foucault's charge that deconstruction is but a 'petty pedagogy,' elaborates an alternative pedagogical possibility contained in Derrida's depiction of philosophy as "caught in the unstable place of being in the totality while simultaneously straining to escape" (143). In Part Four, "Life, Death, Power: New Death Penalties," Robert Trumbull proposes Freud's death drive as a theoretical resource for complicating Foucault's conception of power and better understanding its relation to pleasure; and Deutscher advances a novel interpretative strategy to mine the zones of contact and mutual drift between Foucauldian biopolitics and Derrida's analysis of the death penalty, working in the blind spots of each toward the other to outline future research on "the biopolitics of maternity and the death penalties of sexual difference" (182). Finally, in Part Five, "Foucault's and Derrida's Last Seminars," Custer traces a Foucault-effect in Derrida's late work, arguing that "Like History of Madness, The Animal That Therefore I Am and the death penalty seminars each propose a philosophical analysis of a contemporary form of violence, examining its history in order to identify the transcendental-historical conditions of emergence" (198); and Geoffrey Bennington concludes the volume by arguing that the same "fudging of the enunciative position" (216) that plagued Foucault's History of Madness also compromises his late treatment of parrhesia, provocatively suggesting that Foucault's inability to critically interrogate the conditions of his own discursive production owes to the fact that he "has no theory of reading and cannot have one within the terms of his discourse" (216).

I would, finally, like to raise briefly one point of general criticism. This concerns the absence of sustained discussion of what, in a footnote to her essay, Allen describes as "the difficult and shifting distinction between unreason and madness in History of Madness" (121n.). Marking this distinction between madness, which becomes pathologized as the object of the psychiatric knowledge we call 'mental illness,' and unreason, a tragic limit-experience whose expression in art and literature contests the dominant social order, would add nuance to the presentation of the Foucault-Derrida debate in various ways. For example, it complicates what may be too easily taken as a 'neat' (Macherey) binary opposition between reason and madness in Foucault, and it considerably alters how we view the performative contradiction argument and the problem of enunciation (since the range of expressive possibilities open to Foucault is not limited to the choice between the appropriative voice of reason or the sterile silence of madness). This lacuna notwithstanding, however, this volume succeeds in illuminating the debate's extended archive, clarifying and developing its core philosophical problems, and renewing its critical philosophic force by indicating, as the book's subtitle would have it, the futures of genealogy, deconstruction, and politics.


In the interest of full disclosure, I should mention that I also have a co-edited collection on Foucault and Derrida, with a partial overlap of contributors with the volume under review.

[1] Foucault, History of Madness, translated by Jonathan Murphy and Jean Khalfa (Routledge, 2006), xxxiii.

[2] Ibid., xxxv.

[3] Foucault, History of Madness, xxxi.

[4] Ibid., xxxiii.

[5] See, for example, Foucault, "Foucault," translated by Robert Hurley, in Aesthetics, Method, and Epistemology: Essential Works of Foucault, Volume 2 (The New Press, 1998), 459ff.

[6] Foucault, The Archaeology of Knowledge, translated by A.M. Sheridan Smith (Pantheon, 1972), 127.

[7] Foucault, "Preface to The History of Sexuality, Volume Two," translated by William Smock, in Ethics, Subjectivity, and Truth: Essential Works of Foucault, Volume 1 (The New Press, 1997), 201.

[8] Foucault, "Polemics, Politics, and Problematizations," translated by Lydia Davis, in Ethics, Subjectivity, and Truth, 117.