Foucault's Futures: A Critique of Reproductive Reason

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Penelope Deutscher, Foucault's Futures: A Critique of Reproductive Reason, Columbia University Press, 2017, 261pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231176415.

Reviewed by Colin Koopman, University of Oregon


Penelope Deutscher's latest book is both a continuation of work in four previous books written at the intersection of continental and feminist philosophy, and at the same time a new investigation that brings that intersection to bear specifically on the work of Michel Foucault. Deutscher's three prior monographs were primarily focused on single philosophical figures (Luce Irigaray, Simone de Beauvoir, and Jacques Derrida) in whose work there is without any doubt an extensive engagement with questions of gender and sexual difference. By contrast, Foucault's work has widely been taken to be less concerned, or at least more variably engaged, with matters of gender and sex. Thus feminist scholarship on Foucault has had to do work to stage questions for Foucault's texts whereas such questions are already explicit in the texts of figures like Irigaray, Beauvoir, and even Derrida. That said, this has been an enormously productive tension for Foucauldian feminisms going at least as far back as two books from the early 1990s published in Linda Nicholson's Thinking Gender series: Jana Sawicki's Disciplining Foucault and in a rather different vein Judith Butler's Gender Trouble.1

The neglect of gender and sex on the part of both Foucault's own texts and that of much (not all) of the secondary literature is especially puzzling in light of Foucault's extensive analysis of modern regimes of sexuality in The Will to Know (that is, in Histoire de la sexualité, tome 1: La volonté de savoir, a book whose French title was inconveniently translated as A History of Sexuality, Volume One: An Introduction). How could a thinker whose texts were so poignantly trained on the modern production of our obsessions with sexuality at the very same time neglect to direct their analyses toward the issue of how that obsessive production has sustained gender- and sex-based differences, inequalities, and injustices as among its most prominent products?

To answer the pressing family of issues raised by this question, Deutscher places the problematics of sex and gender in Foucault's work alongside his important concept of biopolitics. The main argumentative focus is an effort to bring together these two otherwise disparate themes of Foucault's work. And to make that argument Deutscher enacts a provocative, and I think entirely impressive, style of philosophical reading. I begin with Deutscher's reading strategy  and then move to the structure of the argument.

Deutscher's argument is oriented by a novel form of philosophical analysis that she describes as one of investigating the "suspended reserves" of the critical resources under her survey (11). This strategy offers a way of reading Foucault simultaneously in light of and in spite of the overt omissions (or "suspensions") of his work and its reception. To get a sense of the capacities and precision of this approach, consider two alternatives that Deutscher declines (a declination that cannot but be a provocation to the prevailing tendencies of philosophical commentary). She does not seek to engage Foucault's work in order to disparage it in light of what is (to some of us, rather obviously) missing from it. Nor does she apologetically debate with the secondary literature on Foucault in order to strategically defend his work from criticisms leveled at what is (again, rather obviously) missing from the surface of his writings.

Both of these styles of engagement have their place in the work of philosophy, of course, but Deutscher's strategy invites us to consider that they may be no more than merely preliminary philosophical gestures. In calling such approaches preliminary I am not suggesting that they are worthless. I am only pointing out that any such reading will always come to a point at which it is forced to confront a further question of what to do with what has been either destabilized or defended. One pithy way in which this question can be put is as follows: 'Perhaps, but so what?' It is this further question concerning what we ought to do with our destabilizing or defensive commentaries to which Deutscher's book responds: "It is an option to mark omissions as foreclosures -- but these can also be read as suspensions" (101).

Deutscher's philosophical strategy is devoted to a retrieval of that which has been suspended specifically in the work of Foucault, but the approach is presumably generalizable. The book thus offers an instructive philosophical resource for those who accept that no philosophical approach can include everything. Surely there are always omissions. But what do we do with them? Do we take them as excuses for dismissing a philosophy? Do we take them as occasions for defending a philosophy? Do we acknowledge them but then quietly decline to care? Or do we work toward a more rigorous investigation and development of that which has been suspended? This last approach has the merits of acknowledging that few suspensions are ever complete omissions. In Foucault's texts, Deutscher shows, the puzzling quiet about gender is just that: a quiet acknowledgment but not a total silence. Deutscher spends time with figures who frequently appear in Foucault's texts as only passing personages: mothers, children, breeding couples, women deemed hysterics, and the like (see 65). In taking note of these figures, Deutscher's book does not give the appearance of wanting to rescue Foucault from his detractors. Rather, it expresses a deft style of excavating from his texts that which they have placed in potentially productive suspense.

The book channels the labor of amplifying suspended reserves in order to deliver on a pressing philosophical challenge raised by the copresence in Foucault's texts of two of his signature themes: biopolitics on the one hand and on the other a constellation orbiting around sex and gender. Deutscher notes in her introduction that the secondary literature on Foucault is curiously divided on these themes in the way it exhibits, "a strong separation between the fields engaging his work on sex (for example within sexuality studies and queer theory) and his work on biopolitics (for example, within post-Foucauldian Italian philosophy)" (2; compare 61, 69, 72).

Before turning to Deutscher's argument for bringing together what otherwise remains disparate in the ongoing uptake of Foucault, a consideration of the book's structure will be useful. Following the introduction, the book stages the division just noted by reading Foucault alongside Derrida in Chapter 1 and queer theorist Lee Edelman in Chapter 2. Chapter 1 engages Derrida's poignant reading of "the relationship between modes of power elaborated in Foucault's work" (19). This is a crucial problematic in the contemporary literature on Foucault's political philosophy and Deutscher's analysis deftly advances the state of the debate. Yet this is a debate that has largely been elaborated in light of what the chapter refers to in its title: "Suspensions of Sex." This suspension is turned around in Chapter 2, in which Deutscher interrogates Edelman alongside Foucault in order to remark "a possible biopolitical aspect" in the former's work that is missing from the surface of the text (61). With this staging in hand, the book's central argument concerning the connection between biopolitics and sex is developed across Chapters 3 through 5. Chapter 3 is devoted to Foucault's The Will to Know, Chapter 4 reads Foucault alongside the two most prominent Italian theorists of biopolitics (Roberto Esposito and Giorgio Agamben), and Chapter 5 concludes by reading Foucault alongside the philosopher who is surely our most prominent contemporary theorist of gender (Judith Butler).

In Chapter 3, Deutscher develops the crucial idea that Foucault's volume on sexuality can be read as anticipating an analytics of "procreation as a hinge between . . . sexuality and . . . biopolitics" (72). She locates in Foucault's book a "reproductive 'hinge'" (77) which holds together sex and biopolitics. These two are held together in a way that allows Deutscher to assert priority for a question that is "nonstag[ed]" in Foucault's work but which "can, nonetheless be thought with its capacities" (82). As she puts it, this crucial question is the following: "How can we understand the genealogical conditions for the problematization of the procreative conduct of women?" (82). In other words, how can genealogy help us excavate the conditions under which women (but not men) become a focus of concern, anxiety, and even fear in the context of procreation? Why for instance are we entrenched in a history in which female conduct (but not male desire) is the site of concern in the context of debates over choice in the context of precarious pregnancies? Why in the context of parenting are women (but not fathers) thoroughly saturated in discourses of responsibilization?

Deutscher frames her question as one concerned with "genealogical conditions" and thereby seems to be suggesting the following: questions concerning problematics of gender and sexual difference can be pursued from a Foucauldian perspective by means of a philosophical analysis of the historical conditions that have produced such differences. Questions of difference, from such a genealogical perspective, would not demand an explanation in terms of anything more fundamental or necessary or universal than a contingent past. That said, Deutscher's reference remains ambiguous. Are her "genealogical conditions" meant to invoke what we might think of in terms of genealogical inquiry into historical conditions of possibility?

It is precisely in the space of such an ambiguity (which could be located more precisely at the level of what a text actually does, that is at the level of the functional methodology deployed at the surface of philosophical argumentation) where I would voice my sole reservation about the book and the suspensions it enacts. For there is very little in this book that one would count as actual genealogical inquiry, in the sense of a patient and empirical practice of studying the historical conditions of the past that bear down upon the possibilities of our present. There is, after the reference to genealogical conditions just cited, a brief engagement with Jacques Donzelot's arguably genealogical book The Policing of Families, which Deutscher refers to as "the first major Foucauldian study" of the family (83ff.). There is also a brief discussion of 19th- and 20th-century United States abortion law (122ff.), a few pages on international inequalities generated by varying abortion laws (154ff., 161ff.) and a narrative expressing how precarious abortion can be in Eastern Europe (174ff.). In reading the book, I found myself craving more such snippets of engaged analysis of historical specificities, a craving that is perhaps only an idiosyncratic after-effect of having been much intoxicated by the empirical precision with which Foucault himself managed to do the work of philosophy vis-à-vis the positivities of the archives.

Genealogy, as a form of historical inquiry, thus feels largely omitted from this book. 'Perhaps, but so what?' It is precisely at such a moment that we should take up Deutscher's strategy of an investigation of suspended capacities in order to regard such an omission not as grounds for an argument against her analysis, but rather as something more like an opening to a more empirical, and therefore possibly more genealogical, route for developing Deutscher's productive insight. In other words, there is nothing in her argument that fails because of its not being genealogical. There are, rather, only resources and potentialities and capacities that remain to be developed. That which a book suspends as merely possible (and without striving to obliterate as impossible) is hardly something that a book somehow owes to its readers. There is an immensity in Deutscher's book that commands our theoretical attention such that those of Foucault's readers who are drawn to the empirical shape of genealogy would do well to take up in her wake.

To consider in that spirit the book's central argument about the hinge between biopolitics and sexuality, consider now its final two chapters. Chapter 4 takes up the debate staged by recent Italian political philosophy between Foucault's work and that of the post-Foucauldian theorists of biopolitics themselves, most notably Esposito and Agamben. As Deutscher registers this debate at one point, "The emphasis on contingency of formation that is available from Foucault's work is replaced by Esposito with an analysis of inevitable and accelerating formations" (113). Deutscher does not seek to resolve this debate but rather to productively engage it in the interests of, borrowing her language from a prior chapter, "developing the mutual capacities that emerge in such encounters" (15). In so doing she is able to show that those on both sides of the debate "are referring intermittently to women and the forms of biopolitical interest that come to include reproduction and the conduct of real or hypothetical maternity" (139).

An interrogation of suspended reserves also informs Chapter 5 where Deutscher is working across the intersections formed between Butler's and Foucault's thought. The chapter proposes to "reroute" Butler's and Foucault's focus on "contingent formations of life toward an interrogation not just of precarious life but also of subjects understood as newly responsible for contingent formations of life: the conjoined making of new forms of ethical subjects" (146). The subjects that come under consideration include those featured by prominent positions in contemporary abortion debates: the figure of the mother, of course, but above all the figure of the fetus. In considering the kinds of ethical demands that may or may not be placed upon us by such subjects, the chapter ends with a call for "a genealogy of the reproductive decision makers, responsibilized as 'moral philosophers,' who have emerged with the biopolitical, as have its objects, its lives and deaths, its legibilities and illegibilities" (189). This is a call for a more particularized practice of political and moral theory.

One can see that Deutscher's argument thus concludes by explicitly inviting precisely the sort of genealogical specificity that one would retrieve from Foucault's genealogical methodology. It is in this sense that Deutscher's text perhaps does not so much omit genealogy as it proposes a theoretical analysis that would be preliminary to any such genealogy in the sense of providing it with the very point that it would need in order to be an effective practice of historico-philosophical critique.

In sum, this book is precise, dense, provocative, and digestive of an enormous swath of contemporary theoretical literature that we all wish we could wield as effectively as Deutscher. It is a book no Foucault scholar will be able to afford to ignore in the coming years. It is also a book whose style of engagement will be a site of learning for anyone who reads in the history of philosophy and finds therein productive impasses.


My thanks to Verena Erlenbusch for characteristically apt comments on a previous draft.

1 See Jana Sawicki, Disciplining Foucault: Feminism, Power, and the Body (Routledge, 1991) and Judith Butler, Gender Trouble: Feminism and the Subversion of Identity (Routledge, 1990).