Foundations and Frontiers of Deliberative Governance

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John S. Dryzek, Foundations and Frontiers of Deliberative Governance, Oxford University Press, 2011, 229pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199562947.

Reviewed by Jaime Ahlberg, University of Florida


John Dryzek's Foundations and Frontiers of Deliberative Governance advances an account of deliberative democracy that is grounded in theory as well as applicable in practice. In the course of stating his own view, Dryzek surveys recent developments in the theorizing and implementation of deliberative democracy. The result is a conceptual landscape that locates the central debates between deliberative democrats with respect to each other as well as critics, supplemented throughout by rich and varied examples, case studies, and social scientific evidence. Dryzek does not aim for a definitive statement of deliberative governance and its applications, nor is he aiming to defend deliberative democracy as a comprehensive catch-all for everything political theory requires. Rather, he offers an approach to deliberative democracy that promises to vindicate it in light of theoretical and practical challenges.

The book is organized into three main parts and a conclusion. The first consists of an introductory chapter that explains the trajectory of the deliberative democracy debate, and isolates what Dryzek believes are the key aspects of deliberative systems. Deliberative systems are to be evaluated by the extent to which they offer deliberative renderings of each of the following logical requirements (12):

  1. Public spaces, ideally inclusive and supportive of free and open communication.
  2. Empowered spaces, which house deliberation and produce collective outcomes.
  3. Mechanisms for transmitting discourse in public spaces to empowered spaces.
  4. Accountability of empowered spaces to the relevant public spaces.
  5. The presence of a meta-deliberation, whereby the system can analyze and, if need be, modify its deliberative practices.
  6. Decisiveness, such that elements (1)-(5) determine the content of collective decisions.

Much of Dryzek's investigation is referenced to these requirements. The theoretical underpinnings he explores -- discursive legitimacy, representation, communication, and meta-consensus -- are articulated, and defended, in light of them. And it is because the list is general and omits the standard, formal institutions of a liberal state that Dryzek's conception of deliberative democracy applies to unconventional kinds of deliberative spaces. Any system embodying elements of this list can be identified as deliberative and evaluated with regard to how well it achieves each of the requirements.

The book's second section, on "foundations", explores the main theoretical commitments of, and challenges to, deliberative democracy. In many ways, Dryzek's account of discursive legitimacy underpins his entire approach to deliberative democracy. Legitimacy has been a difficult problem for deliberative democrats to address, particularly in the face of large scale democracies. Legitimacy, for many deliberative democrats, involves the reflective participation by all those who are subject to the outcome of a collective decision. But when those who are affected by the outcomes of collective decision-making number in the millions, legitimacy looks out of reach. Similarly, such participation requires a great deal of each citizen's time and energy, and requires that groups be properly collaborative. Surely these prerequisites for legitimacy are unrealistic. In chapter 2, Dryzek answers the challenge by referencing legitimacy not to individuals or the presence of democratic institutions or processes, but to discourses in the public sphere.

Discourses are, like individuals, legislatures, and elections, among the things that make up the political world. They are "shared way[s] of comprehending the world embedded in language" (31), conceptual frameworks of sorts that are used to organize and share observations about the world. With reference to economic issues, for example, discourses would include market liberalism, anti-globalization, social democracy, and sustainable development (32). Each person will be party to many discourses, and, Dryzek argues, each person will be in part identified by the discourses in which they engage. Deliberation enters when discourses intersect: when, say, a discourse of market liberalism encounters a discourse motivated by environmental sustainability. Discursive legitimacy exists, then, to the extent that a collective decision responds to the discourses present in the public sphere, and those discourses are "subject to the reflective control of competent actors" (35).

Chapter 3, co-written with Simon Niemeyer, presents a conception of discursive representation that supports Dryzek's conception of legitimacy in its facilitation of the transmission of discourses from the public sphere to empowered spaces. Among the arguments offered in support of discursive representation is a moral one: such representation respects individual autonomy by allowing for many aspects of the self to be represented (through all of the discourses one engages in), rather than only some of the interests and values that people hold (as happens through traditional forms of representation). Thus, it captures individual identities more comprehensively than alternative theories. A "Chamber of Discourses" is explored as a possible forum for representing discourses, whether formalized in political systems or not. Usefully, Dryzek and Niemeyer discuss social scientific methods for identifying discourses relevant to a policy and for finding persons best positioned to participate in the Chamber. Questions regarding the instantiation of Chambers of Discourse are left open; how formalized the Chamber ought to be, and what authority it ought to have in policy creation, must be relativized to the political circumstances within which the Chamber will operate.

Significantly, accountability in discursive representation has to be reconceived, as there are no people to whom the Chamber must be accountable, and no means of sanction by which representatives are held in line (they do not have to consider their popularity next election cycle, for example). To be accountable to a discourse, representatives must "continue to communicate in terms that make sense within that discourse", and any shift to adopt a new discourse must "make sense in the terms established in the original discourse" (61). Of course, it is certainly preferable that representatives remain true to what it is they represent, but to be accountable just is to be held to task when one does not do so, or at least, to be held to task by the threat of sanction. So it is questionable to what extent Dryzek has identified a form of accountability here, as opposed to a desideratum of representatives of discourses. Representatives could, in theory, be criticized as bad representatives when they do not remain true to their discourses, but it is not at all clear how they could be held accountable for their unfaithfulness.

Chapter 4 discusses the types of communication appropriate to discursive democracy. Most interestingly, it mounts a case in favor of the use of rhetoric as a means for transmitting public opinions to empowered space. Rhetoric is understood as the talent of reaching and persuading others. Examples of "bridging" rhetoric that helpfully contributes to deliberation include speeches given by Martin Luther King, Jr. and Nelson Mandela. Well-known dangers accompany the use of rhetoric however, including emotional and rational manipulation. But in light of its potential role in alerting authorities to the content of public debate and to expanding deliberative spaces, Dryzek suggests we focus on the following: does the rhetoric in question contribute to, or detract from, an environment in which competent deliberators become linked in deliberation? If it does in fact have a role to play in constructing such an environment, then the standards of accountability should be applied (as defined above), as well as presumptions against "ugly" and "bonding" rhetoric. With these tests met, the dangers of rhetoric can be mitigated while it is harnessed to facilitate the accurate representation of public discourses in empowered spaces.

Chapter 5, a second chapter co-authored with Simon Niemeyer, contains an argument that consensus at a meta-level can respond to the pluralism of modern, diverse societies. Meta-consensus can be normative (concerning the legitimacy, though not prioritization of, values), epistemic (concerning the reasonableness and relevance of disputed facts), preference-based (concerning the range of suitable alternatives, and the validity of choice structuring), or discursive (regarding the appropriate range of discourses). When meta-consensus is free and reasoned, it can be used to evaluate the deliberative capacities of forums and systems. The authors are hopeful that their four varieties of meta-consensus have practical implications in cases of deep moral and identity clashes, political debates in which contested empirical claims figure prominently, and situations in which the manipulation of decision processes is possible.

The foundations section concludes with a synthesis of discursive representation, communication, and meta-consensus into a restatement of discursive legitimacy:

Legitimacy can be sought in the resonance of collective choices with public opinion, characterized as the provisional outcome of the engagement of discourses in public space as transmitted to public authority in empowered space, to the degree that engagement is regulated by free and reasoned meta-consensus reached by competent and reflective actors. (201, and 115)

A third section on the "frontiers" of deliberative governance draws on this integrated picture of deliberative democracy's foundations to address arenas of political life usually out of deliberative democracy's range: interpreting non-governmental governance networks as deliberative systems; the democratization of authoritarian states through the rise of their deliberative capacities; the promise of mini-publics as loci for deliberative debate; and global deliberation. Dryzek's discursive conception of deliberative democracy facilitates the application of his theory to these areas.

Governance networks are exemplified by corporations, research institutes, interest groups, NGOs, celebrities, academics, and other similar entities (120). Networks often contribute to the production of public goods and purposes, though they are not directly answerable to state agendas. Worries about the anti-democratic potential of such networks abound, since they are not publically authorized, are often populated by society's elites, and very often proceed through invisible or opaque processes. But Dryzek argues that networks at least can be deliberative and democratic. Further, he offers a normative account of democratic networks, highlighting the ways in which they can model discursive legitimacy, representation, communication, and meta-consensus.

In similar ways, Dryzek uses these concepts to capture the deliberative and democratic components of the other frontiers he tackles. The democratization of authoritarian states often involves enhanced deliberative features of society, though no formal democratic institutions yet exist. China, for example, is unlikely to sponsor free elections in the near future. Yet, localized deliberative forums have successfully challenged party officials. Careful analysis of societies in transition can reveal deliberative spaces that achieve some measure of authenticity, inclusion, and effectiveness. Mini-publics (groups of citizens recruited to discuss contentious and/or complex public topics), while often ineffective and always subject to the larger state forces within which they are convened, are instructive microcosms of what happens in deliberation at the larger, national level. They also reveal the potential for ordinary citizens to become informed deliberators about complex ideas and, under certain conditions, can help to enhance the quality and numbers of public deliberative spaces. Lastly, effective and authoritative bodies for attending to global problems are often absent. Instead, global governance networks and 'discursive contests' are often the only sites of international discussion and action. In such circumstances, meta-consensus is particularly important for organizing discourses, rhetoric will be particularly useful for bridging discourses, and often representation will be easier to secure with regard to discourses than with regard to persons.

The promise of Dryzek's account of deliberative governance lies in its avoidance of traditional problems for deliberative democrats: for example, how to achieve legitimacy in large-scale democracies and how to account for the occurrence and value of deliberative systems that have no governmental, and at times no physical, location. These problems are avoided by taking the focus off of individuals, governments, elections, and the like, and placing it onto discourses. Dryzek is successful in capturing the intuition that something democratic is happening in these non-traditional contexts, and it appears to be deliberative in nature. But I am unconvinced that a focus on discourses best captures the theoretical underpinnings of deliberative democracy and, in particular, legitimacy.

Dryzek maintains that his move to discourses is compatible with a deliberative democracy that is 'insistently' critical. Deliberative democrats, he says, can 'override' the existing discourses when there is the serious need to do so (for example, stabilizing the financial market), as well as be attentive to problems of the coopting of power, the self-selection of political participators, and the degree to which discourses are ideological (in the unreflective sense) (38). But his discussions of the critical aspects of deliberative democracy remain largely schematic. Exactly how are Dryzek's deliberative democrats, qua deliberative democrats, able to take such a critical stance?

One particular worry is that we might want to characterize the body of a public's discourses as incomplete; a conversation ought to be happening that is not. I have in mind here not marginalized or inchoate discourses, but absent ones. The most serious instances would involve the positions of marginalized and disenfranchised persons prior to the social movements that enabled their recognition in the public sphere. The danger here is that the deliberative system will be identified as legitimate at the same time as the interests of marginalized persons remain invisible because they are not present in public discourses. If legitimacy is only responsive to extant discourses, there is no ground to claim that bodies of discourses that do not encompass the central interests of all are less than fully legitimate.

A number of responses are open to Dryzek, but this book has not made clear which he would take (if any), or how they might be mobilized to address my concern. First, in such cases, practices in the private sphere exist to solidify the position of those groups. To the extent that discourses embody practices, and not merely conversations, perhaps we could account for the interests of the marginalized by articulating the social practices and norms surrounding those persons. Second, perhaps such cases do not involve deliberators that are sufficiently "competent and reflective". Third, Dryzek might cite the practical work that has been done to illustrate how people can come together (in mini-publics, such as deliberative opinion polls, citizens' assemblies or juries, town meetings, or National Issues Forums, for example) in order to protect against this sort of result. Lastly, Dryzek might simply lean on his claim that discursive democracy does not capture everything of political importance; a different type of theorizing is required to fully capture these kinds of cases. In particular, at one point Dryzek acknowledges that interests may exist independent of discourses, which suggests that interests may fail to be captured by extant discourses (45). Generally, a more explicit discussion of the theoretical limits of discursive democracy might have helped avert, or at least assuage, my concerns here (and perhaps others).

Dryzek's book is a concentrated statement of his account of discursive democracy as it is located in the larger deliberative democracy literature. It aims to be responsive to a wide variety of critics and to expand the extent of deliberative democracy's grasp. The book is not best used as an introduction to the field of deliberative democracy, but it will be beneficial for those who have some familiarity with the field. It is most likely to be helpful for locating Dryzek's view in contemporary debate, and as a springboard for creative thinking about new applications of deliberative democracy.