Foundations for Moral Relativism

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J. David Velleman, Foundations for Moral Relativism, Open Book, 2013, 122pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781909254442.

Reviewed by Antti Kauppinen, Trinity College Dublin


It comes as no surprise that David Velleman's brief but dense new book is original, provocative, erudite, and seductive. Drawing on a characteristically broad range of non-philosophical sources -- such as game studies, anthropology, and ethnomethodology -- he presents novel arguments in defense of moral relativism. In this review, I will examine some of his central arguments.

What is moral relativism? It is not the view that different things are morally right or wrong in different circumstances. Non-relativists agree that whether it is wrong to let a child play alone in the park or dance at a funeral depends on whether there is a risk of significant harm or whether the behavior is disrespectful in context. What they insist on is that context-dependent truths about right and wrong can be derived from the conjunction of non-moral facts of the situation and basic moral principles that are universal in the sense that they apply to everyone regardless of their moral or other beliefs or community membership. This is what relativism denies. Positively, relativism says that there are a variety of communities whose norms are genuinely authoritative for their members.[1]

One way to put the relativist claim is semantic. Velleman says that "it makes no sense to ask whether an action or practice is wrong simpliciter" (45), any more than it makes sense to ask whether someone is tall simpliciter. Just like someone can only be tall-for-X, something can only be wrong-for-members-of-X (or perhaps wrong-by-the-standards-of-X). In each case, the variable may be left implicit to be supplied by the context. Famously, such views have difficulty accommodating the intuition that it's possible for people in different communities (or just people subscribing to different moral standards) to disagree with each other without linguistic confusion. The Catholic from Peru who says that abortion is always wrong and the atheist from Sweden who says it is not always wrong appear to hold conflicting views on the morality of abortion, rather than just making claims about what their own standards or communal norms prohibit or allow.

I suspect Velleman would say that such disagreement is only genuine insofar as the parties are members of the same community (in spite of their differences). Otherwise, they will be speaking past each other after all -- their only disagreement can be in attitude, in what to do. (Velleman has no patience for recently trendy forms of relativism, according to which it is possible for people to disagree faultlessly.[2]) Were they to confusedly maintain that abortion is wrong or not wrong simpliciter, they would be mistaken. Why? According to Velleman, the main argument against universalism is simple: there are communities with different moral norms, and "no one has ever succeeded in showing any one set of norms to be universally valid" (45). To be sure, some might argue that the demand to show that some norms are universally valid (in the sense of providing non-derivative reasons for action for all) is setting the bar too high. An Aristotelian might hold that if some misguided people, or communities, can't be brought to see matters aright, it doesn't mean that there are no universally correct (if context-sensitive) answers to practical questions. At some point the onus is on the relativist or skeptic to offer positive reasons for why, say, pedophilia or exploitation couldn't be pro tanto wrong everywhere.

1. Act-Type Relativity

Velleman does indeed offer a novel positive reason for why no moral norm could be universally valid. Moral norms say that actions of a certain type, such as paying one's debts, are required, permitted, or prohibited. Such norms can only be authoritative for everyone, it seems, if the act-types over which they range are available to everyone, regardless of culture. And this is what Velleman denies. He maintains that different cultures have a different taxonomy of actions, so that their members can neither agree nor disagree about what to do.

Here's roughly how the argument goes. In acting intentionally, we aim at something under a particular description, say making an arrest. How do I make an arrest? Well, where I live, there's a particular script I have to follow -- say certain words, apprehend someone in a certain fashion, take them to the police station. What I do must be recognizable to others as making an arrest, and thus resemble the way arrests are ordinarily made around here, or I'll fail in my aim of performing this type of action. This is particularly important if I'm interacting with others, a category that includes even such actions as minding my own business, as Velleman reminds us (39). In work in progress, he argues that it is constitutive of acting, as opposed to merely behaving, that one has a background aim to exemplify an act-type well, in a way that approximates the socially constituted paradigm. (It is this move from acting well to acting in the ordinary way that arouses suspicion in a non-relativist, as we'll see.)

Of course, in different cultures, arrests are ordinarily made differently, if at all. People have converged on doing different things in different ways. The kind of actions I can intentionally perform -- "doables", as Velleman puts it -- will be different. Even if perceptual concepts can latch onto the joints of the world better or worse, there are no natural action kinds. Drawing on anthropological evidence, Velleman argues that the repertoire of possible speech acts, among others, is different in different cultures. For example, he reports that "Russian has two words for lying: lozh, which denotes an out-and-out lie, and vranyo, for which English has no equivalent." (36) A vranyo is something like an untrue but credible claim that isn't meant to be believed -- although the audience is meant to pretend to believe what is said. One thinks of an announcement of the glorious outcome of the latest five-year plan. Velleman maintains that the existence of such additional act-types has implications for individuating other actions as well:

For both speakers and hearers of Russian, there are two ordinary types of untruthfulness, both of which would count as lying in English. If the Russians' vranyo is a type of action that we don't happen to have, then by the same token our lying is an action-type that they don't quite duplicate, either. (37)

The next step in the argument is that moral disagreement (or agreement) presupposes a shared taxonomy of actions: "Disagreement about morality is disagreement about what may or may not be done, and so it requires agreement about what is doable." (25) If we accept that different things are doable in different communities, it thus follows that cross-cultural moral disagreement is impossible. There's no shared subject matter to disagree about, or common act-types to be governed by universally valid norms -- if the action of lying isn't within the repertoire of a culture, how could it make sense to say its members ought not lie?

This is a suggestive argument. Yet is it really true that Russians cannot lie, strictly speaking? Can a Russian (or Arabic, or Javanese, to take Velleman's other examples) speaker not intentionally mislead the hearer to gain some advantage? (Ask a Ukrainian.) And isn't that what really counts? A universalist might say that even if a speech act doesn't have quite the same significance as lying, it will be pro tanto wrong, as long as it shares the relevant core features (which might not be trivial to specify, given that not all lies are wrong). Velleman may be right that it would be foolish for us to either condemn or praise the practice of vranyo from the outside. But the universalist won't in any case care too much about vranyos (which seem to do no harm), but about the lozh -- the "out-and-out lies", in Velleman's own gloss. Or, perhaps most likely, some vranyos and some lozhs have the wrong-making features, while others don't.

Thus, it doesn't seem sufficient to show that cultures have different taxonomies of action to show that universal principles, formulated at a suitable level of abstraction, can't apply to the actions of their members, or that members of different cultures must lack a focus for disagreeing about, say, the moral status of intentionally misleading others to gain advantage. It will, of course, be harder to pinpoint where the disagreement lies, but Velleman explicitly says that his argument doesn't assume that the conceptual schemes of different cultures are incommensurable (44), so it should be possible.

2. Perspectival Normativity

Suppose, nevertheless, that there are no universally binding moral norms. As Velleman rightly emphasizes, this is only half of the argument for relativism. For relativists are not nihilists: they hold that there are moral norms that are genuinely authoritative for members of moral communities. But how is it even possible for there to be moral norms that are authoritative only for some people? For this to be the case, the same facts or sets of facts must be or generate different reasons for people in virtue of their membership in different communities. As Velleman observes, this sits uneasily with the non-reductionist views -- if being a reason is a primitive normative fact, why would reasons be relative to communities?

So Velleman argues all reasons are grounded in evaluative perspectives. Part of the case is Williamsian reasons (or existence) internalism, according to which considerations are reasons only if they are capable of engaging with the agent's motivations, insofar as she is rational. What Velleman adds here is that such action-guidance is "necessarily relative to a perspective" (62), so that reasons are relative to perspectives. This is because facts are action-guiding only under an implicitly indexical mode of presentation:

'A is wrong-for-members-of-x' is not the complete expression of a fact until the value of x is supplied; but it cannot guide action if that value is supplied explicitly. The value of x is explicitly supplied by anthropology textbooks, which name the community in question, thereby stating a normatively neutral fact. What members of the community say, however, is simply that A is wrong, a statement that is normatively valenced. The latter statement should be interpreted as containing an implicit indexical, as in 'wrong-for-us', the reference of 'us' being supplied by the context of utterance, so that the statement expresses the fact that A is wrong for members of that community, the same fact expressed by the former statement. But the latter statement is normatively valenced because the reference of 'us' is left to be supplied by the context. (47)

I believe that while Velleman is onto something here, the indexicality of action-guidance won't support relativism. First, I doubt if the dimension of explicit/implicit is the right focus -- I've known Finnish people for whom an explicit statement like "A Finn doesn't lie" is action-guiding. What really matters is that action-guidance involves what John Perry calls 'essentially indexical' thoughts: to be guided by a norm telling me to A, I need to somehow derive a thought of the form "I ought to A" from it. And it's true that some people first-personally endorse local norms (implicitly or explicitly), so they can be action-guiding for them. But I want to emphasize that there's no reason why such essentially indexical thoughts would have to refer implicitly to a community-relative norm. For a norm to be action-guiding, I will have to endorse it, but nothing compels me to endorse a norm that is relative to us. In fact, we often seem to endorse non-relative norms. It might even be that we take some considerations to be reasons for us precisely because we take them to be reasons for anyone. Consider the oddity of saying (or thinking) "Torture is wrong, but it's not wrong for ISIS to torture". Here, the second clause takes back what is said in the first, which wouldn't be the case if the first clause implicitly referred to a community-relative fact. Rightly or wrongly, I'm not implicitly thinking that torture is wrong-for-us, but that it's wrong-for-everyone.

Even if relativism doesn't follow from the perspectival nature of action-guidance, it might still be true that the mores, the customs and practices of a community, are the source of moral reasons. And Velleman does offer new and interesting arguments for why a community's "shared ways of thinking, feeling, and acting" (59) are authoritatively action-guiding for its members. He begins with the plausible assumption that human beings, being social animals, have an innate drive or inchoate motivation towards sociality, interacting with others of their kind. Interaction with others requires that we make sense of their pursuits and they make sense of ours. This interpretation, Velleman says, requires something like Davidson's principle of charity: we have to assume, defeasibly, that others believe and desire as we do, by and large. Importantly, to enable others to make sense of ourselves, we must also believe and desire as they do, by and large. We're capable of seeing ourselves as others see us, to an extent, and conforming to their expectations. Mutual interpretability thus requires converging on what to feel and to do, as a rule -- in other words, being ordinary.[3]

Consequently, the basic drive towards sociality gives rise to motivation to do and feel in certain ways just because other members of our community do so, as a rule. Thus, local mores are authoritatively action-guiding for agents. Since different communities converge on different ways of feeling and acting, and reasons for attitudes and actions are grounded in evaluative perspectives, it follows that members of different communities have different reasons for actions and attitudes. So the equation is basically: internalism + drive for sociality + variable convergence = cultural relativism.[4]

A slightly different way of arguing for the conclusion focuses on the link between justification and motivation. Velleman maintains that in our ordinary practice, "we justify our attitudes by showing that they are ordinary, for ourselves and for those in our social vicinity" (57), so that reasons to value derive from what is de facto valued: "the only reasons to value something are features that it shares with other things that are valued, by oneself and by people in general" (57). Suppose I try to justify my admiration of Salman Rushdie to you by pointing out his brashness. If you don't like brash people, this attempt will fall flat -- you won't be swayed. If I can't find something that is ordinarily admired around here about Rushdie, I won't convince people in my community that he's worthy of admiration, or that we ought to act in ways that manifest such admiration. If this happens all the time, it will be tough for people to interpret and interact with me. If, on the other hand, Rushdie has features that my folks converge on admiring, and our admiration of such qualities meshes with what we converge on desiring and emulating, he is admirable (for us), and any further question of whether he is genuinely admirable is moot.

As Velleman acknowledges, this argument for relativism rests on a "speculative sociology" (53) of human motivation and practices of justification. I have some doubts about it. It doesn't ring true, first of all, that showing that our attitudes or actions are ordinary suffices to justify them, either in our own eyes or in the eyes of others. Maybe the ordinary way of arresting black people is brutal. That's just the problem. Doing something well isn't doing it the ordinary way, but rather something like doing it in a way that serves the telos of the activity or the broader practice it's embedded in. To be sure, Velleman can accommodate this, as long as the telos is understood in terms of what is ordinarily wanted from the activity (which some philosophers may question for some activities). Still, it seems that for him, rational criticism must bottom out in convergent communal attitudes.

So the next worry is that there is more to the idea of giving reasons than de facto convincing others around us (and ourselves). It is part of our ordinary practice of justification, I believe, that we put forward considerations we expect or hope would command the assent of all comers, as long as they are reasonable. (The proviso may exclude most members of our actual community.) Here I can't resist quoting another speculative sociologist of our ordinary practices of justification, Jürgen Habermas: "In raising claims to validity, speakers and hearers transcend the provincial standards of a merely particular community of interpreters and their spatiotemporally localized communicative practice." (1993, 54) When we say that Hannah Arendt is admirable in virtue of her deep and unexpected insight into modern statecraft, we are offering a reason that we take to suffice for anyone to admire her, whether or not they actually happen to appreciate such insight. That we take a dim view of those who fail to be moved by such reasons also shows we're not content to appeal to the likeminded in our actual practice. This is not, of course, a decisive argument against relativism. But if this alternative picture is correct, we can be moved by reasons that do not derive from motives for sociality or intelligibility, and relativists can't appeal to ordinary practice of justification for support.

3. Limits of Relativism

Like David Wong (2006), Velleman argues that his kind of relativism doesn't mean that anything goes. Given the common starting point of human nature, of our aversion to pain and suffering, disgust responses, appetites, and the like, there are limits to what kinds of attitudes and actions will make us mutually intelligible (63-67). The need for coordinating effort presumptively favors pro-social rather than anti-social attitudes, since everybody benefits from it, and many forms of interaction are impossible unless we recognize and value each other as beings who are capable of reflexive self-awareness (Chapter 5).

Consequently, even if mores recognizably like ours aren't universal, they're ubiquitous variations on a theme. Indeed, since the function of mores is to promote mutual interpretability, some will be better than others by this non-local standard. In that sense, moral progress is possible. If I understand Velleman correctly, he distinguishes between evaluation of communal norms, for which facilitating social interaction supplies a non-relative standard, and between reasons for acting (and consequently obligations), which remain relative to (better or worse) ways of life. Consequently, "Even if our Western way of life is more advanced, it cannot provide reasons to the members of communities who follow different ways." (68) A universalist will, of course, agree with this last assertion -- if the Kikuyu have a reason not to cut the genitals of little girls, it is not because of anything about the Western way of life, but because of the suffering it means for the girls themselves.

In this review, I have focused on just some of the main arguments of Velleman's new book. Although it is brief at only a 108 pages in the print version, it addresses more questions than I have been able to introduce here, such as the nature of virtual agency and of absurdity. Indeed, as Velleman forthrightly acknowledges, the volume doesn't quite add up to a monograph. The exciting ideas it contains should nevertheless provide fresh impetus to metaethical debates about relativism. Velleman's admirable decision to publish the book for free online (as well as in paperback and hardback versions) will, I hope, further encourage anyone interested in the issues to study them. Even if readers are not convinced, I'm confident they will be stimulated and inspired.


I’d like to thank Anna Alexandrova, Daniel Star, and David Velleman for generous feedback on earlier drafts of this review.


Habermas, Jürgen 1993. Justification and Application: Remarks on Discourse Ethics. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

MacFarlane, John 2014. Assessment-Relativity: Relative Truth and Its Applications. New York: Oxford University Press.

Velleman, David 2009. How We Get Along. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Velleman, David ms. Morality Here and There (accessed May 1, 2015).

Wong, David 2006. Natural Moralities: A Defense of Pluralistic Moral Relativism. New York: Oxford University Press.

[1] To focus on the foundational issues, let's leave aside exactly what constitutes a community or culture, as well as complications arising from multiple memberships.

[2] According to this kind of truth-relativism or non-indexical contextualism, A and B can both express the same proposition, say, eating animals is wrong, with respect to which they disagree, while nevertheless each saying something true. The trick is that on this view, truth of propositions is relative to a circumstance of evaluation, so that the same proposition can be true in A's circumstance and false in B's circumstance, for example (see MacFarlane 2014 for a sophisticated defense). In contrast, on Velleman's view, A and B express different propositions, and thus do not disagree propositionally.

[3] Velleman doesn't deny that we can be motivated to pursue aims that require us to feel or act in ways that others around us can't interpret. But, he says, the force of these motives, too, derives from our need to be interpretable to the minimal community consisting of ourselves. If I couldn't make sense of myself, were I to act as everyone expects me to act, I might have stronger reason to do something that makes me opaque to others.

[4] Elsewhere, Velleman makes the stronger claim that the aim of interpretability is what distinguishes action from mere behavior, so that "the normative force of mores comes from the internal aim of action" (ms), rather than the deep-rooted but still presumably contingent motive for sociality. See also Velleman 2009 for such constitutivist arguments.