Foundations of Metacognition

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Michael J. Beran, Johannes Brandl, Josef Perner, and Joëlle Proust (eds.), Foundations of Metacognition, Oxford University Press, 2012, 353pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199646739.

Reviewed by Glenn Carruthers, Macquarie University


Beran and colleagues have provided an important and useful collection which discusses in rich depth some of the most important issues in the study of metacognition. The book is split into three sections covering debates around the existence of metacognition in non-human animals, the nature of metacognition in young children (mostly pre-schoolers) and the broader functions and nature of metacognition. As we will see, however, there are themes which pervade all three sections. The book will be a valuable resource to researchers and serve as a good way into the study of metacognition for new scholars. It will also be invaluable for those wishing to seek to broaden their horizons regarding the range of positions taken in debates around metacognition. I recommend this book both as research and as reference material.

By taking the broadest available definition of metacognition as "thinking about thinking" and then requiring that all contributors specify what they take metacognition to be, the editors have ensured that every contribution is, at a minimum, clear on foundational issues. This is true even when exploring connections to relatively distinct fields of study such as analytic epistemology (as in the contribution from Egré and Bonnay, Chapter 20). Every chapter makes some commitment regarding foundational issues such as the relationship between metacognition and metarepresentation, Perner (Chapter 6) in particular even being unusually specific as to what defines representation. The choice by the editors to require that such commitments be made explicit allows the astute reader to easily delineate the points of disagreement between the contributions and to focus on the substantive rather than the terminological.

It would be impossible to do justice to the debates, experiments and theories formulated in this book in a short review, so to give you a flavour of the work being done I will consider one example question which appears in almost all chapters. To start this debate we can ask: is the feeling of uncertainty (FoU) metacognitive and what subjects have these experiences?

The feeling of uncertainty is a kind of feeling in which an agent experiences not knowing or not being confident in a solution to a problem. This feeling, we may think, is a regulator of cognition in that it, at least, motivates the search for more information or the selection of "don't know" type responses in particular tasks. I will return to the nature and operationalisation of this kind of feeling shortly, but first I'd like to note how the study of the feeling of uncertainty informs two of the major debates that run through the collection. Let me select two foundational questions regarding metacognition: "What is it?" and "Who has it?" Despite its being a regulator of cognition, there is substantive debate around whether or not FoU counts as a metacognitive feeling. In particular some (e.g., Carruthers and Ritchie, Chapter 5) take it that metarepresentation is necessary for metacognition, prompting two debates around the FoU: Is it metarepresentational? and Does it matter if it's not -- does an agent count as metacognitive if it acts on feelings of uncertainty, or does it need to represent that uncertainty as being represented (i.e., metarepresent uncertainty)? In regards to the "who has it" question about the FoU, there are attempts to show that agents have the feeling as evidenced by performance on certain tasks. However, debates arise as to whether or not such task performance is sufficient evidence of the passion of a FoU.

A central paradigm discussed in regard to FoU is credited to Smith and colleagues' pioneering work with dolphins and involves a perceptual categorisation task. In such tasks a subject is presented with a stimulus, which falls into one of two previously learned categories. The task is to identify the category to which it belongs. Humans and a wide variety of other animals are good at such tasks across a range of stimuli. However, task difficulty increases as the stimuli approach the category boundaries. Say our subjects have been trained to identify arrays with greater than 2500 pixels illuminated as "dense" and those  with 2500 or fewer pixels illuminated as "sparse". For stimuli a long way from this arbitrary boundary (say 10 pixels illuminated) the task is relatively easy, but as we approach the boundary (say 2490 pixels illuminated) the task is hard. If there is something at stake for a right or wrong answer, subjects may wish to 'opt-out' of the difficult trials, giving up the possibility of a reward but certainly avoiding a punishment (e.g., a time out in animal studies, or the loss of game tokens using human subjects). This is the kind of result we see with subjects using "opt-out" responses in categorisations they find more difficult and are more likely to fail. Humans also report feeling uncertain, or feeling that they do not know, in the difficult conditions.

I will use interpretations and criticisms of such studies provided by the various contributions to give a flavour for the debates discussed in the book. I should note that the selection of chapters I present in more detail here is in no way a reflection of the quality or overall importance of particular contributions (see especially, but not exclusively, Call, Chapter 4; Perner, Chapter 6; and Kloo and Rohwer, Chapter 10).  Instead these chapters were selected because the interpretations offered give a good sense of the debates which pervade the collection.

After taking us through this kind of experiment and some important controls (importantly designed to rule out associative learning explanations of task performance), Couchman and colleagues (Chapter 1) consider the performance of some animals on such tasks. They conclude that the evidence of these tasks suggests that some animals, but not others, have the capacity to metacognitively reflect on their experiences of uncertainty. Whilst they do not appear to take the FoU itself to be a metacognitive feeling, they suggest that monitoring the presence of a FoU and adapting behaviour (choosing to 'opt-out') is metacognitive. They suggest that those who fail such tests (such as capuchins) still experience uncertainty, but they do not know that they are uncertain and so cannot change their behaviour in response to this.

There are a number of concerns one may raise against this line of reasoning, not least of which is, if an FoU doesn't guide behaviour without being reflected upon then what does it do in capuchins? Crystal (Chapter 2) provides a further challenge to the interpretation of capuchins' failure given by Couchman and colleagues, highlighting that the reward strategies used to teach the task to capuchins (who failed) differed from those used to teach it to macaques (who passed).

The comparison of passing to failing animals is also challenged by Fujita and colleagues (Chapter 3). They discuss further studies in which pigeons seem to show some metacognitive ability. Whilst Couchman and colleagues reviewed evidence that pigeons failed the kind of task described above, Fujita and colleagues suggest that they succeed at a different kind of task. In particular they succeed when trained to peck at a visually presented item amongst distractors. In the trial phase, after the search, the birds were presented with two response options, the 'risk' option would provide them with a large reward if they had correctly identified the target or a time out if they had not. The 'safe' option would grant the bird a less appealing reward regardless of its success in the visual search. Fujita and colleagues show that the pigeons pecked the 'safe' button significantly more often after trials where they failed to identify the target, a result interpreted as suggesting that they are responsive to how confident they are in their search. However, as it stands, this study may have left open the possibility of an associative learning explanation since it involved a reward to the 'safe' option (see Couchman and colleagues discussion in Chapter 1 of necessary controls and tweaks to design). However, if Fujita and colleagues are right, then their results will challenge Couchman and colleagues' interpretation of failures of pigeons on the categorisation task described above.

These three contributions give us a sense of what some of the central issues are in determining if certain experimental results provide evidence for metacognition. However, we don't yet have a clear understanding of the range of possible understandings of metacognition. The debate framed over these three chapters can be understood as not a debate about whether or not all the tested animals experience a FoU, but whether they can reflect on this feeling. Is this the right way to think about FoU?

If these studies are to be taken as evidence for metacognition, then they need to show evidence of reflection and not just feelings of uncertainty, according to Carruthers and Ritchie (Chapter 5). Carruthers and Ritchie take the strict view that metacognition necessarily involves metarepresentation. Unfortunately, they do not define metarepresentation as precisely as others (e.g., Perner, Chapter 6.). However, what is clear from their view is that they take it that a FoU is not a metarepresentation. FoU for them is an indirect cue-based feeling that represents that there is a problem with the given or considered answer; it does not represent something like degrees of belief that would make it metacognitive. Responses in tasks like that described above then are based on affective responses to answers or potential answers and so are not metarepresentational and so not metacognitive.

Even were she to agree that a FoU is not metarepresentational, Proust (Chapter 14) would not agree that it follows that it is not metacognitive. Proust suggests that whilst the ascription of mental states qua representations is an important function, an exclusive focus on this ignores what is called procedural metacognition (or self-evaluative metacognition). This kind of monitoring involves the representation of what is being cognitively done and of expected outcomes in order to adjust cognition appropriately. As such, even on Carruthers and Ritchie's interpretation of the FoU, it would still count as metacognitive since it is monitoring what can be achieved via a particular cognitive process (selecting an answer) and it motivates the change in cognition (toward selecting an 'opt-out' response for example). We have then added an extra layer of debate regarding the interpretation of the paradigm introduced above. It turns not just on whether control experiments can rule out associative learning explanations but also on what kind of processes we wish to study under the label of metacognition.

Although there is much to say about particular contributions, readers will find that much of this already exists within the collection. We are left, to my mind, with a fairly balanced interpretation of the overall state of the metacognitive literature provided by key authors within the area. Volumes such as this, which collect a variety of perspectives, are not, of course, monolithic entities. There is little, then, to provide in terms of critique of the book. That said there are a number of omissions, which readers should be aware of, but I emphasise that these omissions do not severely limit the importance of this book.

Most importantly, there is little discussion of the different forms that metacognitive judgements may take. Although distinctions such as that between procedural metacognition and theory of mind (ToM) are repeatedly discussed, little is said about the related, but importantly different distinction between monitoring representations (aka experience based judgements) which represent cognitive processes as they occur and metacognitive theories (aka knowledge based judgements) which are constituted by theoretical claims about how minds do and ought to work. 'Metacognitive theories' needn't be considered co-extensive with ToM in that they need not involve attribution of specific mental states (qua representations) to oneself or others, including, in addition, predictions about the general outcomes of processes. An example of such a theoretical claim could be stated as: "I am not good at maths, so should I try and solve equations I will likely fail". We see also that such theories need to involve metarepresentation. Claims such as "I am (not) good at maths" are claims about dispositions to likely success or failure on certain kinds of problem; they needn't explicitly represent the representational nature of mathematical thinking. To be clear, this distinction does come into play in the contributions made in section three of the book, titled "Functions of Metacognition". However, the importance of this distinction is underplayed, even in the contribution by Koriat, who has been a strong advocate of distinguishing different forms of metacognitive judgement.  I would recommend that readers also read Koriat's (2007) contribution as a supplement to the book if it is to be used as an introduction to metacognition.

The second limitation is the lack of discussion regarding the relationship between consciousness and metacognition. To be fair this reflects a broader focus in the metacognitive literature on conscious metacognition, and so it is unsurprising that this issue receives little attention, beyond mention (in e.g., Dienes Chapter 16) of higher-order-thought theories of consciousness (where such HOTs are a form a metacognition) . That said, I think the possibility of unconscious metacognition could have been addressed in detail in a volume such as this. For example, if we follow those such as Proust who take it that metarepresentation is not necessary for metacognition, then a wider variety of regulative processes begin to look metacognitive. For example, the automatic inhibition of loose associations between words is a process (or set of processes) which seems to fail in symptoms such as thought derailment in schizophrenia. But such a process is typically entirely unconscious; we are simply unaware of the fact that we need to inhibit possible associations between words and ideas in order to function. This kind of inhibition, involving as it does the regulation of cognitive acts such as speech, would seem, on the broader kind of definition, to count as metacognitive. Yet these processes are not discussed in this volume.

Finally, there is limited discussion of the use of social interaction or other 'external' entities in metacognitive processes. The only example I was able to find was Metcalfe and Son's discussion of Panzee the chimp (pp. 295-296) using a previously uninteresting toy as a distraction in a delayed reward task. Indeed in the introduction the editors define a cognitive process as necessarily an 'inner process' (p. 3). This seems to preclude the use by Panzee of the distraction from the study of metacognition, as it is no longer a wholly internal process. Yet quick reflection tells us that the use of external tools and of social interactions is an important strategy for the regulation of cognitive processes. Panzee has given us a nice example of the former, but with regard to the latter one may simply think of a time when one felt bad and so sought an attractive or interesting person to lift one's mood. Even those unwilling to take the extra step to saying that these acts constitute a kind of extended or emergent cognition can acknowledge the importance of social interactions and external tools in metacognitive regulation. As such the book would have benefited from the inclusion of more explicit discussion of the role of external tools and social interaction.


My thanks go to Laura May Bottrill for proof reading this review.


Koriat, A. (2007). Metacognition and consciousness. Cambridge handbook of consciousness. P. D. Zelazo, M. Moscovitch and E. Thompson, CUP.