Foundations of the Everyday: Shock, Deferral, Repetition

Placeholder book cover

Eran Dorfman, Foundations of the Everyday: Shock, Deferral, Repetition, Rowman and Littlefield, 2014, 216pp., $37.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781783480500.

Reviewed by Dylan Trigg, University of Memphis/University College Dublin


Eran Dorfman seeks to critically revive the concept of the everyday as a central term in philosophical vocabulary. His reference to "foundation" in his titles reinforces this aim. For Dorfman, the term "foundation" marks the dynamic "background against which any significant activity occurs" (1-2). Such a conception of the everyday plays upon an ambiguity between the foundation as a site of stability and the foundation as a process of constant renewal and transformation. His book, drawing on both psychoanalysis and phenomenology, is an intriguing analysis of the multifaceted ways in which the everyday serves as a foundation of our bodily and cultural existence.

At the heart of this work is a threefold structure indicated in the title: shock, deferral, repetition. To take each term in turn, shock indexes a movement of going outside of the "global movement" of the everyday, such as when there is the felt experience of interruption in one's habitual existence (3). In the face of this instance of shock, Dorfman posits a mechanism of deferral, which unfolds as a suspension of the everyday. Alongside deferral, the act of repetition seeks to understand the structure of shock itself, thus compelling the subject to return in each instance to where the shock began. His example is of brushing one's teeth and encountering pain when doing so. If the shock is marked by the pain, then the deferral takes form as either momentarily pausing or otherwise avoiding the region altogether. Taken in this context, repetition of brushing one's teeth presents itself as a way of trying to understand where the pain is situated (4).

It is a curiously prosaic example to develop this methodology, but it allows Dorfman to plot the ways in which late modernity deals -- and also fails to deal -- with shocks and their subsequent deferrals. Indeed, the book's critical focus is that late modernity suffers from a "crisis of the everyday," manifest as an inability to "acquire anything new," and structured as a divide between the everyday and experience (5). Dorfman's book thus concerns, on the one hand, a phenomenology of lived experience of the everyday. On the other hand, the book is a psychoanalytically informed critique of late modernity, in which the everyday has entered a "deficient" mode of functioning, a deficiency Dorfman pursues through various cultural and literary artefacts (6).

Philosophically, the concept of the everyday has a strained history. At once venerated by Lefebvre, Sartre, Heidegger, and finding its phenomenological origin in Husserl's concept of the lifeworld, the same concept has also been oddly neglected. Dorfman is sympathetic to Husserl's plea to return to the things themselves, and it is in this spirit that his thinking takes its point of departure. Thus in the first chapter, he explores the multifaceted ways in which phenomenology suspends the everyday as it is presented in the Husserlian natural attitude through the methodological epoché (32). What is important about the epoché as a "figure of suspension" is that it thematizes the significance of the everyday through transforming it. This movement Dorfman traces through various modalities in Heidegger's thought, not least the celebrated analysis of broken equipment in Being and Time (44-45). The analysis of broken or missing equipment in particular demonstrates what Dorfman is seeking to develop in his theory of the everyday; namely, the object breaks down (shock), Dasein then suspends (defers) the everyday in order to best reflect upon the origin of the breakage. This reflection affords space to learn how to repair, replace, or relearn how to use the object (repetition) in order to integrate newly found knowledge into the foundation of the everyday (45).

It is against this Heideggerian light that one wonders about the privileged status Dorfman assigns to shock. He pursues the value of negativity in Heidegger's thought as a movement of revelation (most clearly delineated in his discussion of the value of anxiety). While Dorfman helpfully expands on the Heideggerian heritage by situating negativity within the concrete and empirical reality of the everyday, a more critical engagement with the privilege attached to shock and breakage would be welcome. A similar tact, for example, is evident in Dorfman's approach to Merleau-Ponty, where it is assumed but not argued that "pathology shows what everyday normality conceals" (74). Here, a series of questions present themselves, not least, to what extent does the logic of shock presuppose a normative account of the world and of the bodies who inhabit the world?

In the second chapter, Dorfman purses the structure of the everyday in and through Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology of the body (65). What he exports from Merleau-Ponty's analysis of the body is the ambiguity central to our bodily existence, an ambiguity that concerns not simply the body as both object and subject, but also a crossing between the personal and the impersonal. Dorfman outlines two modes of ambiguity, an ontological ambiguity and a psychological ambiguity, which he illustrates through the example of dance (an illustration that is arguably overserved in Merleau-Ponty scholarship). If ontological ambiguity marks the structure of prepersonal intercorporeality, which Merleau-Ponty returns to time and again, then psychological ambiguity, counters this movement with a "refusal to merge" (69). There is, thus, a tension inherent in bodily existence, so far as the ontological structure of the body is always already in touch with other people irrespective of whether or not "I" as a personal and psychological self desire that contact (social anxiety would be an especially visceral example of this tension (cf. Trigg 2013)).

Dorfman traces the theme of ontological ambiguity through Merleau-Ponty's notion of flesh, and in doing so, misreads what is central to the flesh. Rather than being a primordial form of intersubjective ambiguity, in which "I fully belong," Merleau-Ponty's conception of the flesh, beyond being irreducible to experience, in fact marks a radical departure from the body as understood phenomenologically. At this phase in his thinking, Merleau-Ponty is not seeking to plot an ethics of bodily action, but instead outline the ways in which the human body is marked as the "presentation of a certain absence . . . of which our body, the sensible sentient, is a very remarkable variation" (Merleau-Ponty 1968, 136). Dorfman's claim remains unconvincing, and in order to develop it, recourse to Merleau-Ponty's writings on psychoanalysis and nature would be required. Other aspects of his engagement with Merleau-Ponty are problematic, such as the association between "impersonal existence" and Heidegger's concept of inauthenticity (77). Such a view is contentious given that the repression involved in impersonal existence is less a way of attuning oneself to the body, as it would be in Heidegger, and more a prepersonal structure of embodied existence. These remarks do not undermine the value of Dorfman's ideas, but instead point to a certain tension in his reading of Merleau-Ponty.

For all that, Dorfman's engagement with phenomenology is valuable and needed. What he brings to light is that in the works of Merleau-Ponty and Heidegger, negativity -- be it in pathology or anxiety -- tends to only find its ultimate place within a mode of non-everyday existence, which thus reduces the everyday to something ordinary and inauthentic. To my mind, Dorfman is right to refuse this plea toward transforming or sublimating the everyday into a "sphere of authenticity," as it is precisely this level of analysis that has been overlooked. Thus, if the first part of the book is concerned with the ontological appropriation of the everyday, then in the second part, Dorfman turns to the everyday as a site of shock and defense, exemplified in the works of Freud and Benjamin.

The turn to Freud in the third chapter signals a deeper interrogation of the themes of deferral and repetition. What Dorfman finds of interest in Freud is an understanding of the mechanism of repetition as being meaningful irrespective of the affective (pleasurable) dimension in which the act takes place (106). The compulsive quality of repetition existing beyond the pleasure principle provides a space for him to explore Freud's account of trauma as a rupture or breach in the defense of the psyche, which is ultimately traceable to a primordial -- indeed, prehistoric -- trauma that brings about life itself (107-110). Against this scenario, anxiety assumes a central place in the structure of subjective life. Anxiety materialises here as the means through which the over-production of stimulus from the external world is internalised, and thereby domesticated, through displacing the object of anxiety. Dorfman weaves the strands of Freud's thought with his own analysis on the everyday, developing these lines of thought through trauma theory in the work of Cathy Caruth. Dorfman's claim is that Freud is ultimately a theoretician of shock rather than trauma, the difference being that shock diffuses itself less definably in place and time whereas trauma tends to remain hinged at one point (128). This psychoanalysis of shock, as it were, explains in part how culture itself is the work of shock even if -- or especially if -- no such symptoms are present.

As a reader of Freud, Dorfman is incisive and lucid (though the omission of Freud's essay on the uncanny is striking, as is that of the lesser known essay "A Disturbance of Memory on the Acropolis." Both articles deal precisely with the sense of being over sensitised, and, therefore shocked into uncanniness in the first instance, and, shocked into derealization in the second instance). Nonetheless, these readings only take form when situated within the remainder of the book, which returns the Freudian themes back to their everyday context; that is, through the work of Benjamin.

The final two chapters set about extending the Freudian framework to modernity. Dorfman's motivation for turning to Benjamin is to understand the relation between the everyday, repetition and mass production, and how these relations shape personal identity (127). The account of the "decline of the aura," which is central to Benjamin's thinking in turn becomes instructive for Dorfman, too. To see this, Dorfman begins with the distinction found in Benjamin between "long experience" and "immediate experience" (138). The function of the immediate experience is to "parry" shock before it reaches the level of unconsciousness, where it will leave its trace. Thus, the task of this initial shock is to receive stimulus in such a way that it can be controlled precisely through rendering the stimulus an object of experience, manifest therein as a voluntary memory rather than something that haunts both involuntary memory and unconsciousness at once (139). This explains, for Dorfman, "why the modern everyday is full of 'events' or 'shocks' that nevertheless leave the impression that nothing 'happens'" (139). The critical question in this discussion -- and indeed throughout the book -- concerns whether or not shock can be integrated in and through deferral rather than taken up and therefore nullified through immediate experience. Dorfman resists providing any clear answers to this question but traces the outline of a response through his own working of Benjamin's concept of the aura, which he terms "the aura of the habitual" (143).

In the final chapter, Dorfman develops this concept of the everyday aura, which is placed at the constantly moving intersection between the strange and the familiar, colliding at all times with multiplies timescales, each of which constitutes the foundation of the everyday. To explain this, he provides an analysis of Cindy Sherman's work, Untitled Film Stills. The photographs in this series consist of several women -- in fact, all of them are the artist in disguise -- immersed in everyday activities, yet Dorfman finds something within these images that "transcends the everyday and gives it a cinematic allure" (174). In one image, a woman retrieves a book in a library, but her gaze, instead of being drawn to the book, is instead orientated at a point outside the frame. Dorfman interprets these series of images as disconnections of body parts, such that each part is thrown into question with one another. This corporeal dislocation also reveals a cultural and social dimension in that what is mirrored in the image is "both (the event and the everyday) being defined through each other, overcoming (their) modern opposition" (174). Such encounters give rise to an everyday aura, an aura situated in the "meeting point of familiarity and strangeness, habituation and shock" (175).

With his rich descriptions of Sherman's angels echoing Paul Klee's celebrated Angelus Novus, Dorfman's book ends with an oddly phenomenological turn, and indeed he is at his strongest when writing in a phenomenological tone. On this point, one wonders to what extent Dorfman's valuable concept of the "the aura of the habitual" could be extended through engaging more directly with Merleau-Ponty's account of the artwork. Indeed, Dorfman runs close to Merleau-Ponty, especially in the latter's treatment of Cézanne, in attending to the strange, uncanny, and inhuman dimension of the world, which is ordinarily dulled through habit, but nevertheless taken up and enacted precisely through our habitual relation to the world. These omissions do not suggest a deficiency, but instead mark the potential for further applications of the framework set out in this enjoyable and worthwhile book.


Merleau-Ponty, M. (1968). The Visible and the Invisible. Trans. A. Lingis. Evanston: Northwestern University Press.

Trigg, D. (2013). "The body of the other: intercorporeality and the phenomenology of agoraphobia" Continental Philosophy Review 46:3, pp. 413-429.