Four Views on Free Will

Placeholder book cover

John Martin Fischer, Robert Kane, Derk Pereboom, and Manuel Vargas, Four Views on Free Will, Blackwell Publishing, 2007, 232pp., $31.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405134866.

Reviewed by Daniel Speak, Loyola Marymount University


Four Views on Free Will is an excellent introduction to the current debate regarding one of the most seductive of the perennial topics in philosophy. It is an especially welcome addition to Blackwell's "Great Debates in Philosophy" series. For those unfamiliar with the series, the expectation is that authors representing distinctive positions in the relevant debate will contribute substantial original essays aimed at exploring and defending their positions. In addition, each contributing author is invited to add a further chapter responding to the original contributions of the others. The goal is the presentation of a considerably more dialogical and engaging introduction to the main issues in an important domain of philosophical inquiry than can typically be achieved in a standard monograph. Four Views succeeds admirably in achieving this worthwhile goal.

The original essays by each of the contributors serve as introductions, but not merely as introductions. Each essay is indeed a substantial contribution to the literature in its own right. The authors (John Martin Fischer, Robert Kane, Derk Pereboom, and Manuel Vargas) are all recognized figures in the field -- the first three are luminaries and Vargas is a notable rising star -- whose contributions to this project are appropriately condensed and stylized explications of their influential views. The response chapters put these philosophers into just the sort of profitable dialogue from which real insight and understanding can emerge. Though reading Four Views would be an insufficient substitute for working carefully through the full corpus of each of its authors, I am inclined to conclude that the book and its format rather uniquely illuminate the contemporary free will debate.

After a very brief introduction to some crucial terms and concepts, Four Views begins with Robert Kane's explication and defense of libertarianism. Recall that libertarianism asserts that human beings (of the ordinary variety) do in fact enjoy free will -- and this is true, at least in part, because causal determinism is asserted to be false. One implication of this view is that if determinism were true then there would be no free will. Libertarianism is, then, committed to the truth of indeterminism. Though Kane is moved by fairly familiar impulses and arguments to reject compatibilism, his positive defense of libertarianism depends on unique strategies. For example, while limiting himself to the mundane powers of naturalized agents, Kane attempts to address worries about indeterministic luck by challenging the intuition that chanciness would undermine moral responsibility. The crucial move involves showing how indeterminism in the brain, at the level of the complex interactions of neural networks, could contribute to our enjoying free will. In Kane's story, we are asked to imagine that deliberations involving conflict between more than one fundamental agential value "stir up" indeterminacies in the brain. Kane grants that the indeterminacies become an obstacle to the agent's resolution of the deliberative process. If the agent is trying to decide whether to help a crime victim or make it on time to an important meeting, we can imagine that her internal tension about the matter creates a kind of chaos at the neural level -- as the interaction between the network associated with her deciding to help and the network associated with her deciding to go to the meeting brings about (or constitutes) a state of affairs the outcome of which is genuinely indeterministic. Though the agent will now have to "push through" the indeterminism to make her decision, this special obstacle might also allow her to be the author of her "self". In virtue of the agent's dual processing, whichever decision she makes will be one that she was trying to make. In short, Kane claims that indeterminism arising from this sort of system will permit the agent to perform a "self-forming action" that can function to ground basic desert-entailing moral responsibility.

Compatibilism is the view that free will and moral responsibility are not necessarily threatened by the truth of the thesis of causal determinism. As the representative of contemporary compatibilism, John Martin Fischer is, in the second chapter of Four Views, characteristically sensitive to the limitations of his compatibilist predecessors. At the same time he is especially adept at presenting his view persuasively. Indeed, his own distinctive version of compatibilism -- a view he has dubbed "semicompatibilism" -- is premised on an attractive Solomonic wisdom. In other words, Fischer attempts to give incompatibilism its due (principally by accepting the force of the consequence argument) while maintaining the core compatibilist insight (namely, that all causally deterministic processes are not created equal). The view that results from Fischer's charity is that while free will may be incompatible with determinism, moral responsibility need not be. His considered position relies on the success of Frankfurt-style counterexamples to the principle of alternative possibilities. If the ability to do otherwise than what one has done is strictly irrelevant to moral responsibility, as the Frankfurt cases purport to demonstrate, then the possibility that causal determinism is also irrelevant to responsibility can come into sharper relief. Fischer claims that the irrelevance of alternative possibilities ought to turn our attention to what happens in the actual sequence of morally responsible action. In addition, he outlines some of his reasoning for the further claim that what matters in the actual sequence is that the agent be properly responsive to reasons. Fischer bookends the second chapter with his distinctive appeal to the desirability of a uniquely resilient account of morally responsible agency. He claims, more precisely, that "[o]ne of the main virtues of compatibilism is that our deepest and most basic views about our agency -- our freedom and moral responsibility -- are not held hostage to views in physics" (p. 81).

Derk Pereboom's third chapter gives voice to what might be considered the most pessimistic outlook in the book. As a descendent of hard determinism, Pereboom's "hard incompatibilism" is premised on denying that human beings are free and responsible in the basic sense defended by traditional libertarians and compatibilists. Despite this pessimism, Pereboom attempts to soften the blow by demonstrating that it does not entail moral disaster. He argues that the absence of moral responsibility would not undermine all our intuitive grounds for the moral life -- and even that the acceptance of hard incompatibilism might have some morally desirable consequences. Of special interest is the multi-pronged strategy Pereboom employs to reach his pessimistic conclusion. First he argues, on the basis of what he takes to be his own successful Frankfurt-style example, that alternative possibilities are not necessary for moral responsibility. Thus, if incompatibilism is true it must be because causal determinism would keep us from being the appropriate sources of our actions. Pereboom then attacks compatibilism on the basis of a manipulation argument. Put tersely, his "four case" argument is supposed to show that there is no principled difference between an agent who is causally determined to perform some action and an agent who is manipulated into performing the same action in a way that almost everyone will admit is responsibility-undermining. His remaining task is to challenge source libertarianism. Pereboom does this by arguing first that event-causal libertarianism (instanced most visibly by Kane) cannot provide a satisfying answer to the luck objection. Second, he claims that agent-causal versions of libertarianism are empirically indefensible. We are left with the conclusion, then, that no successful account of either compatibilism or libertarianism remains to ground freedom and responsibility. Nevertheless, Pereboom insists that this sad fact does not mean (1) that there is no moral wrongness, (2) that we lose the meaning of our lives, or (3) that personal relationships no longer matter.

Finally, Manuel Vargas defends a view that appears to be a distinct new-comer to the free will debate. In virtue of its recent arrival on the scene, the contours and boundaries of what he calls "revisionism" are somewhat less crisp and familiar. Nevertheless, Vargas makes considerable progress in explaining the view and motivating his reader to accept it. Revisionism begins with the recognition that one deep and widespread strain of ordinary thinking about free will is incompatibilistic. Rather than deny or minimize this fact, as compatibilists are wont to do, Vargas urges us to understand this commonsensical impulse as an expression of our shared western cultural history. Given this history, we should not be surprised to find ourselves compelled by the traditional incompatibilistic arguments. Nor should we be surprised to find that experimentalists can elicit broadly incompatibilistic intuitions from us. According to Vargas, however, the metaphysical outlook that would be required to ground these intuitions is naturalistically implausible. In response to this implausibility, he recommends that we revise our shared concept of moral responsibility in the direction of compatibilism. To understand what is distinctive about revisionism, it may help to see it more specifically compared and contrasted with its competitors. Vargas's revisionism, as I've noted, agrees with libertarianism in diagnosing our folk concept of moral responsibility in incompatibilist terms. Like Pereboom's hard incompatibilism, though, it denies that our folk concept can be vindicated. Indeed, the arguments Vargas employs to make this denial are similar to those mustered by Pereboom. Why isn't Vargas simply a hard incompatibilist, then? The answer is that Pereboom's view is rash. Rather than abandon the concept of moral responsibility in the face of its implausibly demanding metaphysics we can take a more staid approach by challenging the authority of our folk intuitions. According to Vargas, hard incompatibilism unnecessarily presupposes that the folk concept of moral responsibility gives us all the evidence we need about its actual theoretical content. By contrast, the revisionist strategy is to execute a systematic and clear-eyed transformation of the concept of moral responsibility in keeping with our best empirical data and the highest attainable normative goals compatible therewith. Vargas argues inventively that much of commonsense thinking about moral responsibility can be saved by re-anchoring it to broadly compatibilistic structures. Given his willingness to abandon the demand to match commonsense, however, he is not subject to the complaints about evasion and subterfuge that have plagued compatibilism.

Though I haven't the space to comment in detail on the response chapters that compose the final third of the book, I will note again that they are illuminating and interesting. The authors take fair and forceful aim at each other's views, pull no punches, respond creatively to each other, and generally provide an admirable model of how philosophical dialogue ought to unfold. Almost all the challenges a reviewer might raise to each of the first four chapters are anticipated and thoughtfully presented in the book's final four chapters. In fact, those already familiar with the contemporary debate are likely to find the most innovative and suggestive material in these chapters. Kane, for example, responds in a new way to the claim that his view is naturalistically implausible. All the authors are pushed by the emergence of revisionism to clarify the relation between folk intuitions and theoretical commitments. Their concluding discussions about specific topics (e.g., the role of Frankfurt-cases, on the distinction between leeway and source incompatibilism, the "four case" argument) result in very interesting contributions.

Particulars aside, the four contributing authors appear to share a more or less unstated methodological or meta-philosophical commitment worth highlighting (and perhaps worth subjecting to scrutiny). Each author appears, that is, to be defending his view by affecting a balance between two commitments: what I will call "naturalistic evidentialism" on the one hand and "moral conservativism" on the other. The conservativism restrains how far an account of free will can allow for departures from ordinary moral thought. Thus, even Pereboom, whose views depart most sharply from commonsense moral thinking, attempts to square his hard incompatibilism with deeper moral impulses that everyone can continue to share. The evidentialism I take the authors to be accepting limits, to the purely natural and epistemic, the range of considerations that can count in favor of a view. It is for this reason, for example, that Kane, whose views appear to make the greatest empirical demands, abandons the strategy of "extra factor" libertarianism and takes seriously Vargas's charge of naturalistic implausibility. It is no doubt in part because the authors share these broad commitments that they can interact in such fair-minded and fruitful ways throughout the book. Though this is not the place to launch a concerted attack on either naturalistic evidentialism or moral conservativism, I would like to register a concern about the coherence and limitation of the shared methodology. To see this concern, notice that strict dedication to either commitment will officially eliminate the other. In stringently committing oneself to naturalistic evidentialism, one undermines the normative power of moral conservativism, and vice versa (or something near enough). After all, there is no obvious reason to suppose that the preservation of commonsense morality would make the sort of epistemic contribution demanded by the commitment to naturalistic evidentialism. Similarly, only an ungrounded and unnatural hope could inspire us to think that the natural world is going to conspire with folk moral thinking to work out an unproblematic fit between them. All of this is to say what may have seemed obvious from the start; that if one of our goals in theorizing about free will is to maintain some commitment to both the evidentialist and conservative impulses, then neither can be granted unconditional authority. This is not to deny that the truth on these matters could turn out to be both maximally plausible from the naturalistic point of view and maximally satisfying from the point of view of commonsense morality. Rather, it is to deny the coherence of a methodology that attempts to find the truth on these matters by granting to either commitment unlimited privilege and scope (while also granting any privilege and scope to the other commitment). Now, I have to admit that part of what makes each of the positions defended in Four Views plausible and attractive is the balance each has attempted to achieve between the two commitments. Perhaps this is because all four views cluster toward the middle along a continuum stretching between the two poles of commitment. The point at which I am gesturing is that the balancing methodology permits a wider distribution of views along this continuum than the four canvassed in the book. My temptation is to conclude that considerably more attention ought to be paid to the relationship between epistemic and moral values in the free will debate. Furthermore, it seems to me that the need for this attention is somewhat obscured in the contemporary debate just as it is in Four Views. I am hopeful, however, that these deeper axiological issues will be the subject of more open discussion in the next wave of debate.

By way of conclusion, and on what some will see as a related point, I will temper my enthusiasm for Four Views with one small complaint. In deference to Roderick Chisholm, David Velleman once suggested that the goal of the philosophy of action should be to earn the right to make jokes about primitive agent-causation.[1] Though Four Views makes few jokes at its expense, the agent-causal view does suffer the somewhat ignominious fate of being formally ignored. More accurately, the agent-causal view is treated only as a foil (with Pereboom coming the closest to taking the view seriously). Given the fine work done in recent years by Randolph Clarke and Timothy O'Connor (among others) to motivate and defend agent-causal libertarianism, I think it fair to characterize this mild slight as a shortcoming of an otherwise excellent volume.

[1] "What Happens When Someone Acts," Mind, p. 469 (Oxford University Press).