Framing Democracy: A Behavioral Approach to Democratic Theory

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Jamie Terence Kelly, Framing Democracy: A Behavioral Approach to Democratic Theory, Princeton University Press, 2012, 157pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691155197.

Reviewed by Christian Schemmel, University of Frankfurt


What are the implications for normative democratic theory of behavioral research into the impact of framing on human decision-making capacities? This is the question that Jamie Terence Kelly sets out to answer. He maintains that investigating the importance that different theories of democracy should ascribe to framing effects will throw light on the moral arguments for democracy that these theories can give, and on their plausibility.

This is an interesting new area of research that has not previously received any sustained treatment in the literature on normative democratic theory, and, for this reason, Kelly presents a worthwhile contribution that deserves close attention.

The book proceeds in five steps. Chapter 1 delivers a thorough review of behavioral research into framing effects, discusses their importance for political philosophy, and rebuts a series of objections denying this importance. Chapter 2 presents an array of democratic theories, ordered according to the "epistemic demands" (44) they place on citizens' political judgment, from preference-based social choice theory at the lower end to "correctness theories" (58), which locate the value of democracy exclusively in its capacity to generate correct decisions, at the upper end, passing through different varieties of democratic theories, especially deliberative theories, in the middle. Chapter 3 explains the advantages a behavioral approach to individual epistemic competence promises to have over approaches that, in Kelly's view, skirt the problem by simply asserting such competence, making idealized assumptions about it, or regarding it as morally required to treat people as sufficiently competent. Chapter 4 takes up the array of theories presented in chapter 2, walks us through them to show how troubled each of them ought to be by framing effects, and discusses how the respective level of trouble reflects on the plausibility of the reasons the theory in question offers for endorsing democracy. Chapter 5 discusses the institutional implications of research into framing effects, and makes a series of proposals for countering their potentially pernicious effects.

Kelly argues, grosso modo, that normative democratic theories requiring little individual judgment in democratic processes (such as preference-based theories, most obviously social-choice theory) have less reason to be worried about framing effects than those requiring more (such as epistemic theories of democracy). But that fact simply underscores that the former theories do not yield a strong moral case for endorsing democracy to start with. Insofar as we are to believe that there is such a case -- and insofar as this case has to be based, to a significant extent, on democracy's capacity to meet certain requirements of "epistemic reliability" (80) -- this result should render us skeptical towards these theories (chapter 4).

The book is clearly and tightly written. Kelly's discussions of the philosophical relevance of empirical findings are especially thoughtful. His command of the empirical literature on framing effects is impressive. Accordingly, the reader who is not familiar with such research -- the majority of normative democratic theorists, I surmise -- will learn a great deal from Kelly's analysis. I certainly did.

Chapter 1 provides an excellent introduction to behavioral research into human decision-making capacities (including, but not restricted to, the now classical works of Kahneman and Tversky), which has come to be known as the "heuristics-and-biases" literature (8). Kelly zooms in on the question of framing effects as the pertinent one for the book, and delivers a lucid analysis of the problem that they pose for democratic theorists. The existence of framing effects can be most easily demonstrated in equivalency cases, "where different but formally equivalent presentations of a decision problem elicit different choices" (12). However, the more interesting case for politics and democracy is that of emphasis framing effects, where equivalency cannot be demonstrated, yet there is good reason to believe that "emphasizing different elements of a decision problem elicits different choices" (14). This may concern the way political questions (say in referendums) are ordered (16), worded (17), or embedded into the political context (18) -- for example, by highlighting the continuity of a proposed policy with past policies, or by presenting it as a radical change.

Yet, even if we are convinced that framing exists, it is not immediately clear which philosophical problem it poses. Intuitively, framing may seem a problematic manipulation of citizens' preferences, but all political questions have to be framed in some way, or ways (infinite frames are not an option), thus arguably leading to some preferences as opposed to others -- and what if presenting them in a particular way leads to better decisions? Kelly persuasively shows that questions such as these have not been dealt with adequately in the literature on political framing (20-33). He proposes to locate the particular problems of framing effects in political decision-making not in their impact on preference formation, but on judgmentformation: on their potential to divert citizens' attention away from the proper reasons and evaluative standards that in fact apply to a given problem (36). These may be standards of "truth, morality, or justice" (36) -- Kelly remains non-committal here. The chapter does a very good job at explaining both the relevant empirical research and its philosophical importance, and is a strong candidate for reading lists of advanced courses bringing together empirical and philosophical literature on democracy.

Similarly instructive is the treatment of the implications of framing effects for institutional arrangements in chapter 5. That free and plural political speech is necessary for citizens to be able to compare and evaluate competing frames for political problems (98-101), and that this requires antitrust measures preventing media monopolies and oligopolies and assuring suitable media independence (104-107), is not particularly surprising. More intriguingly, Kelly also argues that the same consideration is an argument for multiparty systems (101-104). Since parties devote significant resources to researching issues and presenting them to the electorate in distinctive ways, we should be concerned with having "a large number of viable political parties" (103) to assure sufficient beneficial competition between frames. This is particularly interesting since multiparty systems have often been lauded for being fairer, because they allow effective representation of a broader range of citizens' preferences. Kelly's argument shows why they might have an epistemic edge over two-party systems, as well. One hopes that there will be future empirical research on the relationship between the number of parties and the quality of public discussion.

Despite having located the primary disvalue of framing in its potential to distract us from the most relevant considerations (see above), Kelly does not entertain any suggestion that we should restrict the number of existing frames to those that indeed tend to lead to substantively correct outcomes. Since it is not clear how we can identify these, we should go for plurality and competition (108-110). He is, however, generally open to supplementing democracy with judicial review (112-117) and, given that judgment failures regarding risk assessment (118-119) are particularly well-documented, also with risk review by experts -- as any supporter of democracy on predominantly epistemic grounds has to be. Somewhat surprising, however, is the curt treatment that education receives. If the problem with framing is one of "individual competence", it seems that "educating citizens" should have been the first response to the problem. Yet Kelly only briefly discusses education (119-121), noting that evidence on the positive value of counter-framing education is mixed. His commitment to education as "the most plausible means of addressing epistemic concerns about democratic decision-making" (121) hence remains somewhat unsubstantiated.

Kelly's overall argument (chapters 2-4) regarding the importance of framing effects for different normative theories of democracy goes like this: the less worried a theory needs to be about framing, the weaker are the moral arguments it can provide for democracy; insofar as we believe that there is a strong case for it, this casts doubts on the theory.  This argument is, for most of the theories discussed, plausible (see below, however, for some detailed criticism). Regarding minimalist theories of democracy, such as social choice theory, Kelly's conclusion is not surprising: as he himself notes (47), these theories are better regarded as indictments than as endorsements of democracy. Chapter 3 makes a convincing case that normative democratic theories cannot simply ignore behavioral research, and delivers a nuanced assessment of the general importance of the latter in terms of the former. Once more, readers can learn a lot from the detailed discussions of how framing poses different sorts of problems for different theories. It is not possible to do justice to them here; let me merely flag the discussions of "augmented stability theories" (84-87) and Condorcet theories (94-95) as, in my view, two particularly good examples.

In this part, I found myself, however, partly unconvinced by the general frame Kelly offers for analyzing the problem (as one of individual "epistemic competence" (59)), and in particular by the way some theories of deliberative democracy are subsumed under it. I also have some quibbles with Kelly's attempt at "cost-benefit analysis" (59) regarding framing effects, that is, his approach towards the question of the costs that supporters of different theories of democracy should be willing to incur to counter framing effects and secure the various benefits of democracy. I will address these two points in turn.

First, there are questions about framing and individual epistemic competence. Coming from the empirical "heuristics-and-biases" literature, it is natural to regard the existence of framing effects as a problem of individual cognitive competence. However, it is less natural to suppose that all relevant normative democratic theories can be neatly ordered according to the epistemic demands they place on individual judgment in the way Kelly supposes (chapters 2 and 4). According to him, the less a democratic theory requires that citizens be right in their decisions, the less it need be worried about framing effects. Yet theories could hold that, due to intractable disagreement, there is, in many cases, no identifiable independent standard that democratic judgment has to correspond with, and they could still be concerned about the effects of framing on judgment. This seems true for theories of "deep deliberative democracy", such as those put forward by Habermas, J. Cohen, Gutmann, and others (48-49, 80-82).

Kelly echoes David Estlund's[1] well-known criticism that these theories must appeal to the instrumental orientation of democratic procedures towards correct results, and cannot appeal to their intrinsic value (such as their fairness) alone (48-49, 76-82) -- otherwise their commitment to deliberation, as opposed to any other fair procedure, becomes unsubstantiated. Yet it seems possible to be committed to deliberative procedures for judgment-based reasons while being less sanguine about their capacity to track substantive standards (of truth, or justice). On such an account, we will want to weed out clear errors of judgment, and will partly locate the value of deliberative procedures in their capacity to do so, but we may nevertheless emphasize the respect they express for individuals' capacity for autonomous reasoning over their instrumental qualities. Valuing this capacity could be a plausible additional basis for objecting to certain ways of framing political questions -- for example, those that discourage such reasoning, and/or reflect objectionable inequalities of power at the stage of agenda setting.

Locating these theories on the lower end of a spectrum of epistemic demands on citizens, as Kelly proposes, hence seems to do some analytical violence to them. That they do not require people to get it right is not due to low demands on individual judgment, in any straightforward sense; it is due to a philosophical background position about the unavailability of sufficiently clear and precise independent standards. So it seems that one should engage with this background position. This is not to say that Estlund's criticism is wholly off the mark. It is to point out that repeating it will not convince deep deliberative democrats that Kelly has done justice to them -- it might have been appropriate to let such theories speak more with their own voice and to take more seriously the possibility that framing may be bad (also) for what it does to people's judgment and reasoning, understood in more procedural terms. This possibility receives no sustained treatment in the book. What is more, it also seems to dovetail with Kelly's own institutional recommendation of generating plural and competing frames and to abstain from directly aiming at those frames that promise to produce the best outcomes (108-110, see above), because these cannot be reliably identified. Is this not, in large part, what deep deliberative democrats have been saying all along? Kelly insists on the necessity of being committed to an idea of independent standards, but what these standards could be is never discussed in detail. This casts some doubts on the appropriateness of the proposed one-dimensional ordering of democratic theories according to different degrees of substantive correctness of individuals' judgments.

Secondly, there is the issue of costs. Kelly argues that taking the behavioral approach seriously allows us to undertake a particular kind of "cost-benefit analysis" (59): which costs should a given theory of democracy be willing to incur to counter framing and to secure the benefits of democracy, and what light does this throw on the theory? The list of benefits given by Kelly is diverse: "political autonomy, fairness, the equality of citizens, social stability, substantively correct decisions in politics, and the legitimacy of laws" (70). Kelly tends, as we have seen, towards views that emphasize the epistemic qualities of democracy; that such theories will, in his view, be prepared to incur considerable costs -- in the form of institutional reform (chapter 5) -- is supposed to underscore the strength of the reasons these views give for democracy. This is unexceptionable if "costs" are understood, straightforwardly, as referring to how much we should be willing to pay right now for anti-framing arrangements that are not yet in place.

However, the question of costs raises deeper philosophical issues. On theories locating democracy's value mainly in correct decisions, the point of anti-framing measures is to avoidsubstantively wrong decisions. Such decisions will themselves be costly, in whatever metric the theory in question puts forward. On this view, anti-framing measures should hence come out mainly as investments delivering net benefits in the long term. Seen in this way, it is not particularly controversial that one should make such investments if one can. It also seems appropriate to say that theories emphasizing fairness, political autonomy, and the equality of citizens could, if they find sufficient grounds for objecting to framing, actually be prepared to countenance more net costs in order to combat it than the former kinds of theories.

A more thorough treatment of issues such as these would have been worthwhile -- perhaps going beyond outlining a general behavioral approach and taking a few more steps towards the development of a particular, behaviorally informed, normative theory of democracy (and of the exact balance between epistemic and non-epistemic reasons for democracy that it would propose). However, this book represents a very useful first foray into investigating the relevance of behavioral research for normative democratic theories, and it is to be hoped that further works will follow, by Kelly and others.

[1] David Estlund, Democratic Authority: A Philosophical Framework, Princeton University Press 2008, chapters 4 and 5.