Frances Power Cobbe: Essential Writings of a Nineteenth-Century Feminist Philosopher

Frances Power Cobbe

Frances Power Cobbe and Alison Stone (ed), Frances Power Cobbe: Essential Writings of a Nineteenth-Century Feminist Philosopher, Oxford University Press, 2022, 261pp. $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780197628232.

Reviewed by Karen Green, University of Melbourne


This selection of essays from the pen of Frances Power Cobbe is the latest addition to the Oxford New Histories of Philosophy series, which sets out to publish editions of works by women and people of color ‘that were groundbreaking in their day but left out of traditional accounts’ of the history of philosophy (vii). As with other editions in the series, the selection begins with an introductory account of the life and philosophical significance of the author. Alison Stone tells us that ‘Cobbe was extremely well known in her time; her views were widely discussed, and she helped shape the intellectual and philosophical landscape of Victorian Britain’ (6). Indeed, she emerges from this selection as a quintessentially Victorian moralist, whose prose resonates with the kind of sententious sermonizing, so characteristic of the age (42). Two sections of the introduction, titled ‘Intuitive Morals, Animal Ethics, and Feminism,’ and ‘Mind, Darwinism, Sympathy, and Religion,’ provide an overview of the themes dealt with in the selections, which are all animated by one sustaining thread, the proposition that without religion and belief in a fundamentally Christian God, there can be no genuine morality and humanity is doomed.

The first essay, ‘What is the Moral Law?’ which comes from Cobbe’s An Essay on Intuitive Morals (1855), proposes that ‘the moral character of good or evil is a real, universal, and eternal distinction, existing through all worlds and for ever, wherever there are rational creatures and free agents’ (46). Cobbe does not argue for this proposition but grounds it on the authority of Montesquieu, Ralph Cudworth, Samuel Clarke, and others working within the tradition of Cambridge Platonism, though she chides Clarke for not distinguishing the absurdity involved in not accepting the universally true moral law from the sinfulness of not obeying it (46, note). The Moral Law she says, ‘exists necessarily in the nature of things founded on distinctions properly belonging to the actions and sentiments of rational beings, as the distinctions of equality and inequality belong to numbers’ (50). Like her eighteenth-century precursors, Catharine Trotter Cockburn and Catharine Macaulay, whose views were also colored by Cambridge Platonism, Cobbe is an intellectualist, who accepts that since the moral law has the same epistemological status as mathematics, even God could not make these necessary truths false.  She concludes, going well beyond these earlier women, that we intuitively possess moral knowledge that is the same as God’s. ‘Our intuition is His tuition’ (55). Whereas Cockburn was concerned that, if the epistemological status of morality is equivalent to that of mathematics, Christian revelation may be no more relevant for acquiring knowledge of the moral law than for recognizing the truth of Pythagoras’ theorem, Cobbe remains blissfully unconcerned by any such doubts. She concludes ‘the Moral Law is the resumption of the eternal necessary Obligation of all Rational Free Agents to do and feel those actions and sentiments which are Right’ (76). Virtue is obedience to this moral law and free rational agents are made for virtue, which is the ultimate purpose of God’s universe.

The following two essays, ‘The Rights of Man and the Claims of Brutes’ (1863) and ‘The Final Cause of Woman’ (1869) apply the theory that our end is virtue. The first is a condemnation of vivisection and other cruel treatments of animals. Here, despite the Kantian resonances of her claim that there exists a moral law that obliges all rational agents, Cobbe sides with Bentham on the question of whether we have direct duties to animals. ‘We are bound to consider the welfare of the brutes for their sakes, not ours, and because they are so constituted as to suffer and enjoy’ (96). Like Catharine Macaulay before her, she recognizes that humans have moral obligations towards animals. Indeed, the position taken by these women is rather more consistent than that adopted by Peter Singer, who claims that ‘all animals are equal’, which invites the response, ‘If we are all equal and animals have no moral obligations towards us, why assume that we have obligations towards them?’ These women claim that our excellence consists in the exercise of virtue, which obliges us to care about what is good for animals, even though their good is grounded in sentience and not in rationality. Like Mary Astell, Macaulay, Mary Wollstonecraft, and earlier women writing in the Christian tradition, going back at least to the Quakers, Cobbe also grounds her case for women’s education and liberty on the fact that, as rational beings, their end consists in virtue, so they should be given the means to develop themselves as virtuous beings. For, ‘The woman who lives to God in the first place, can, better than anyone else, serve man in the second’ (124). Unlike these earlier women, but like Macaulay’s contemporary Hannah More, who thought talk of the ‘rights of women’ nonsense, Cobbe adds that such a woman will ‘rejoice to be a wife and mother’ and make her home ‘a little heaven of love and peace’ as well as exercising philanthropy and engaging in literature, politics, and art (124). Rational women, she assumes, will willingly embrace their destiny as angels of the hearth. Although she mocks August Comte’s ‘worship of women’ and rejects his ‘physical’ view, that the purpose of women is to be wives and mothers (113–18), she assumes that, as rational moral agents, they will virtuously embrace these traditional roles.

The following four essays, in various ways, confront the challenge that Darwin’s theory of evolution and materialism pose to the theologically grounded moralism set out in the first. ‘Unconscious Cerebration’ (1870) is the most original: it deals with the pressing problem of whether matter can think, which, since at least the time of Locke had been assumed to distinguish theistic dualists from atheistic materialists. Rather than denying that matter can think, Cobbe takes the enormous evidence for what she calls ‘unconscious cerebration’ as compelling evidence that the brain thinks without our voluntary control. Dreams, unconscious memory, automatic activity, etc., all show that the brain exercises many thinking functions. But rather than concluding that the materialists have won the day, she argues that we cannot identify ourselves with the brain that thus unconsciously thinks, rather our conscious selves are clearly distinct from this unconscious brain activity (148). So, that matter can think in no way militates against the hope that, ‘“the spirit”––the Conscious Self of Man––“shall return to God who made it”’ (149).

‘Darwinism in Morals’ (1871) and ‘A Faithless World’ (1884) in rather different ways defend the theistically grounded moral theory that she supports, the first by criticizing Darwinian accounts of the evolution of morality, the second by opposing the claim, made by James Stephen (Virginia Woolf’s uncle), that we can get on very well without religion. In the first, Cobbe’s strategy is not to deny evolutionary theory as a scientific theory, but rather to see it as uncovering the means employed by God in the creation of humanity. She argues that, nevertheless, moral sentiment and knowledge of moral truth cannot simply have evolved but must have been specifically implanted in humans at some point in evolution. She rightly focuses on the question that Darwin attempted to answer: how did we evolve a moral conscience (157)? Having given a rough outline of Darwin’s account of the evolution of moral sentiments, she concludes, correctly, that it implies that innate moral dispositions have evolved because they helped survival and that this shows that moral principles are not universal or eternal but relative to the circumstances in which humanity finds itself. Morality will have no authority ‘beyond the limits of our race and special social state’ (160). These doctrines appear to her as ‘simply the most dangerous which have ever been set forth since the days of Mandeville’ (160). She believes that if generally accepted they will ‘sound the knell of the virtue of mankind’ (161). They cannot be right because Darwin cannot explain ‘Repentance as the most sacred of all sentiments.’ It is repentance by which humans have ‘measured the nearness of the soul to God by the depth of its sense of the shame and heinousness of sin’ (161). She fails completely to recognize that the Darwinian can simply propose that the evolution of repentance accompanied the evolution of the idea of a transcendent, just God, who sees into our innermost intentions and judges us, as others would judge us. These ideas undoubtedly evolved as powerful inhibitors of immoral acts, harmful to society but motivated by the short-term interest or passions of the individual. Cobbe faults Darwin’s account of the evolution of repentance but fails to explore whether a better account can be provided.

‘A Faithless World’ attempts to show that, far from the decline of religious belief being unimportant for society, it would be an absolute disaster. Moreover, Cobbe does not mean by ‘religion’ any religious belief or sentiment such as found in Buddhism or Hinduism but Judeo-Christian religion involving ‘faith in God and immortality’ (216). She lists the changes that a loss of faith would entail; the decline of public worship and private prayer, the transformation of the Sabbath from a day for worship into a day of relaxation and pleasure, the reduction of the Bible ‘to the rank of an historical and literary curiosity’ (218–20). These predictions have, indeed, been shown to be accurate, but are they disasters? She predicts as well a ‘belittling of life’ and loss of Christian Charity, which would be of greater concern, but seem not to have transpired. If anything, the recognition that this is the only life there is has tended to make individuals cling to it with greater tenacity. Charity, she thinks will diminish under the influence of the doctrine of ‘survival of the fittest’ (226), forgetting that Darwin had argued that genuine moral sentiment evolved because it made us social animals, more fit for survival, because we are motivated to care for each other.

The last essay in the collection to be discussed, ‘Heteropathy, Aversion, Sympathy, or The Evolution of the Social Sentiment’ (1874) is something of an outlier. It sits uncomfortably with the intellectualism of the first and is deeply infected by a blinkered Christian triumphalism. From at least the thirteenth century, Christians have believed in a historical progress through three eras, that of the Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit. This belief in progress towards enlightenment was taken up in the eighteenth century in the guise of the progress of reason. But Cobbe postulates not a progress of reason towards understanding the universal moral truth, but a progress of humanity from what she calls ‘heteropathy’ towards sympathy. ‘Heteropathy’ is feeling pleasure at the pain of others and pain at their pleasure. Animals, she claims, are pitiless, tending to ‘destroy their sick and aged or wounded companions’ (182). While

Keeping these facts of animal life in view, we are surely justified in interpreting the murderous practices in vogue to the present day among many savage tribes (and formerly common all over the world) as monumental institutions, preserving still the evidence of the early sway of the same passion of Heteropathy in the human race in its lowest stage of development. (183)

Having castigated all the ancient civilizations for their brutality, she surmises that ‘parallel and nearly contemporaneously with the idea of a common Humanity, arose the idea of a common Christianity, forming the bond of still more sacred mutual Sympathy’ (201). Rejecting the idea that the hope of the human race lies in the ‘Progress of the Intellect’ she imagines,

the lofty summits of an emotion transcending all that our race yet has experienced, a Sympathy which shall shine on the joys and melt with the sorrows, not only of the Lovely, but of the Unlovely and thus make man at last “perfect as his Father in Heaven, who makes his sun rise on the evil and on the good, and sendeth rain on the just and the unjust” [Matthew 5:45] (210).

She concludes with a paeon to Christian love, ‘the growth within him of the godlike faculty of love and self-sacrifice, the development of that holiest Sympathy wherein all souls shall blend at last’ (211). Elsewhere she excused herself from dwelling on the many harms inflicted in the name of her favored religion (216).

As someone implicated in recent attempts to recover the works of female philosophers, these essays made me ponder the criteria for judging which works are worth republishing. From one point of view, reviving Cobbe might be justified as a salutary reminder of attitudes that were prevalent during the nineteenth century, when high minded colonists saw themselves as raising the poor savage from her abject animality toward the heights of Christian love. They are of historical interest also for evidence of the long legacy of Christian Platonism into the nineteenth century, and for the commonality in themes with earlier feminists. But can one say of them that they ‘were groundbreaking in their day’ or even that they are models of philosophy? Cobbe shows little tendency to self-doubt and never attempts to deal with the obvious objections to, and weaknesses in, her own favored positions. She preaches rather than philosophizes. She is dogmatic and it is a dangerous dogmatism. For those who accept with her that God has given them intuitive knowledge of universal and eternal moral laws are, like her, quick to condemn as moral brutes, those who fail to recognize these supposedly universal laws. The conditional ‘without God there is no morality,’ invites the riposte, there is no God, so there is no morality. Yet, whether or not God exists, humans experience moral sentiments. That self-consciousness and conscience exist is more evident than that God does. Accepting that they have evolved may imply that moral principles are relative, but it is dangerous to conclude that this implies their arbitrariness. Looked at from the point of view of evolution, morality is more like medicine than mathematics. Its prescriptions will be relative to the nature, condition, knowledge, and circumstances of the body in question, but this does not invalidate all morality. Rather it leaves us with the difficult philosophical question, what moral principles are we obliged to follow to preserve humanity in the here and now? This is a question with which Cobbe cannot not help us.