Francis Bacon and the Transformation of Early-Modern Philosophy

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Gaukroger, Stephen, Francis Bacon and the Transformation of Early-Modern Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 262pp, $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-521-80536-8.

Reviewed by Eleonora Montuschi , London School of Economics


This is an interesting example of philosophical history. Stephen Gaukroger interprets Bacon as the exemplar of a change in ‘mentality’ which occurred between the late Medieval and the Renaissance periods. The change concerns the understanding of philosophy as an activity: questions were raised as to the point of the exercise, its rationale, and most of all the identity of the persona of the philosopher. Gaukroger takes the latter to be the focus of his study, and works his way through the transformations concerning the practice of philosophy, using Bacon as a paradigmatic case. Although, as Gaukroger reminds us, the birth of the modern notion of the scientist involved a long-term process, which was fully accomplished only well into the nineteenth century, its origins can be traced back to the sixteenth century. And although this process is indeed bigger than Bacon, Bacon’s project can be seen as having initiated two crucial changes in the history of this process. On the one hand, it was “the first systematic, comprehensive attempt to transform the early modern philosopher from someone whose primary concern is with how to live morally into someone whose primary concern is with the understanding of and reshaping of natural processes.” [p. 5] On the other, it was the first attempt to make the activity the philosopher engages himself in a communal, rather than individual, effort. These two changes, concerning both the practice of philosophy and the identity of its practitioners, are taken by Gaukroger to be the core ingredients in the gradual emergence of the new mentality (though the book gives the former more attention than the latter), and together they set the scene for the book’s engaging and scholarly reconstruction of Bacon’s philosophical project. The book has a good balance between philosophical argument and expository detail. A broad range of Bacon’s writings are taken into account and patiently presented to the reader, often and helpfully without assuming any familiarity with their content or structure. For this reason the book can also be profitably read as an instructive and thought provoking introduction to Bacon’s demanding and dense corpus of philosophical speculation.

The word ‘mentality’ is recurrent in the book. Gaukroger takes its meaning for granted, so the reader feels entitled to do the same – or at least, she intuitively refers it to that complex of values, beliefs, habits of thought, and intellectual apparatuses, which eventually ‘materialize’ in some kind of collectively shared mental structure. It is this mental structure, or collective mind, which can then be used to explain the socio-historical behavior of certain groups of individuals at particular periods in time. Histories of mentality, as is well known, are often looked at with some suspicion. Collective mentalities, or collective minds, are rather ambiguous and artificially construed explanatory tools. Only individuals really think … By focusing on Bacon’s views and, at the same time, using them as a paradigmatic case of a changing mentality, Gaukroger circumvents suspicion, and lets his analysis happily oscillate between the history of ideas and the psychology of knowledge.

The structure of the book can ideally be divided in two parts. The first part is a discussion of Bacon’s project in terms of its new attitude towards knowledge (Ch.1), its models for knowledge (Ch.2), and its “legitimation” of knowledge (Ch.3). The second part is a reconstruction of the shaping of the natural philosopher in terms of, firstly, his attitude towards practical knowledge and of his identity as the ‘new sage’ (in contrast with earlier thinkers’ personas (Ch.4)); and, secondly, his behavior towards the impediments to knowledge and his psychological/spiritual struggle to follow the dictates of method, which appear to be so contrary to the philosopher’s most natural inclinations (Ch.5). The final chapter takes on a discussion of the importance of the theory of matter for Bacon’s overall project. As Gaukroger reminds us earlier on in the book, matter theory is Bacon’s route to natural philosophy. It provides the latter with its metaphysics: ‘accounting for the behavior of physical bodies in terms of their constituent corpuscles reveals what lies at the basis of that behavior, and so ultimately enables us to manipulate it.’ [p.93] For this reason, Gaukroger’s discussion of Bacon’s theory of matter is carried out in the context of the idea of human dominion over nature: matter is what the natural philosopher is to apply his knowledge to, exercise his power on, and finally rule over.

In the first part of the book, the opening chapter assesses the importance that “the shift from esoteric to public knowledge”, well established in the sixteenth century, had for Bacon’s goal of reforming natural philosophy [p.5], and the crucial part played, within this shift, by a widespread concern with reforming the role and behavior of the practitioners of natural philosophy. At the heart of both this shift and concern stands the idea, rooted among the English humanists of the sixteenth century, that knowledge has to be useful, and that “the practical sciences [are] superior to theoretical knowledge.” [p.14] Bacon’s own take on this idea is, according to Gaukroger, his belief that the value of philosophy is “its ability to contribute to the general welfare.” [p.16] It is in the context of this belief that Gaukroger offers his reading of one of the most controversial (and widely discussed) claims in Bacon’s project, namely that knowledge is power. For Gaukroger, the claim should be read as a claim about power, rather than one about knowledge – a claim “about something practical and useful, telling us that knowledge plays a hitherto unrecognized role in power. The model is not Plato but Machiavelli.” [p.16] Bacon’s aim is not to reform knowledge per se, Gaukroger argues, but to use a reformed kind of knowledge in order to practice power in a more responsible manner: a good tool in the hand of a good sovereign. [p.18] Political power ought to be shaped around political understanding, and political understanding must be informed by various forms of knowledge, and first of all scientific knowledge (as Bacon, for example, argues in ‘A Brief Discourse touching the Happy Union of the Kingdoms of England and Scotland’). Here Bacon is portrayed as a typical Renaissance humanist, totally committed to “the importance of sound learning for sound government” [p.69], and at the same time willing to provide the adequate means for making the connection between the two work in practice. In Chapter 3 further evidence is given to support and contextualize Bacon’s political view of knowledge, by adding – among other things – a further crucial ingredient for this understanding, namely the religious aspect of it. [p.76] The “legitimation” of natural philosophy as a restoration of human dominion over nature is twofold, political and religious (as clearly stated, for example, in Book I of ‘The Advancement of Learning’). “Natural philosophy, for Bacon as for his contemporaries, was a theory about nature understood as a creation of a Christian God” [p.77], and the Fall an evil to be rectified by a good use of knowledge. This does not mean that natural philosophy is nothing but theology. Theology mediates between politics and natural philosophy, and somehow justifies the pursuit of knowledge within, and not against, God’s plans. In his reading of the myth of Prometheus (almost certainly influenced by Judeo-Christian interpretations, highlighting connections between Prometheus and Adam/Cain), Bacon not only draws a line between things human and things divine, but also tries to suggest where such a line is to be drawn. Prometheus’s theft of fire, which exemplifies the origin of the mechanical arts, is to be punished not because of what Prometheus ends up possessing, but because of the way Prometheus achieves his aim: he sets himself against the Gods, and by doing what he does he effectively puts himself in their place.

Between his discussion of Bacon’s new attitude towards knowledge and that of the “legitimation” of the practice of natural philosophy, Gaukroger strategically undertakes an analysis of the models of inquiry which inspired Bacon’s reform of natural philosophy and which motivated his concern for methodological questions. I take this chapter to be crucial to the story Gaukroger is to recount, as arguably it provides a framework of analogies and of building blocks within which the new view of knowledge and the psychology of the natural philosopher emerge and take shape. Gaukroger rightly points out that during the Renaissance these models were drawn not from mathematics or mechanics (which only gradually made their appearance during the seventeenth century), but rather from the legal-rhetorical tradition (taught as part of the liberal arts). As a matter of fact, Bacon’s first aim was to reform the law and politics, rather than natural philosophy. In order to understand how Bacon’s concern with the former became relevant to pursuing his program of reform within the latter, attention is to be paid to a third ingredient: “rhetoric contains the art of discovery that underlies both law and natural philosophy.” However, law and natural philosophy relate differently to rhetoric, since the former, if adequately reformed, is a “paradigm manifestation of rhetoric” in a way that the latter is not (not yet). Therefore, the law is in a privileged position “to act as a model for all inquiry. The law is a model for natural philosophy because of its intimate connection with rhetoric.” [p.58]

In a way that will be more explicitly specified in chapter 4, the role played by rhetoric in the reform of natural philosophy and in the psychological reconstruction of the natural philosopher’s mentality is presented in much clearer and better defined terms than the role played by the model of legal inquiry in the shaping of the idea of scientific method (as discussed in chapter 5). “Rhetoric is, among other things, a theory about how to engage the emotions”, Gaukroger argues [p.103]. In the context of Bacon’s acknowledged value of practical knowledge, persuasion and the presentation of material are an intrinsic part of that psychological dimension of knowledge which defines the limits of Bacon’s overall epistemological approach. “Engaging the emotions” includes the capacity of “transforming one’s faculty” [p.104], which plays such an important role in the procedure of purging the natural philosopher’s mind from the impediments to knowledge, and of disposing it towards the acceptance and use of methodological precepts. In treating the Idola as internal impediments to the achievement of knowledge (as explained in chapter 4), Bacon questions what psychological or cognitive “state” the natural philosopher must be in order to pursue his aim. In looking at Idola as psychological sources of error, Gaukroger interprets Bacon’s classification both as a systematic study of the types of mentalities which give rise to the errors themselves, and as an endorsement of the rhetorical approach to the study of the mind. (p.121)

What about the law? What aspects of legal procedure and of legal reasoning attract Bacon’s attention as regards natural inquiry? What type of reformed legal system might prove useful both to remedy the practice of the law and to reform natural philosophy? Overall, Gaukroger acknowledges the “parallels between the malaise of natural philosophy in England and the inappropriate way in which the law and public administration are pursued in England” [p.57], as well as Bacon’s common route to solving the problems of both (i.e., focusing reforms on questions of evidence and demonstration). Beyond this, Gaukroger appears hesitant to explore the analogy between legal procedure and natural philosophy. One ought to be “cautious about simply translating” from one field to the other, he claims. [p.66] “There are all kinds of contingent and local factors which prevent a straightforward application of the one [field] to the other” [p.67]. Indeed, Gaukroger stands by his own words. In chapter 5, where he describes Bacon’s method of inquiry, he hardly refers to the legal model (with the exception of a reference to Bacon’s “evident legal training” in the section on “prerogative instances”), nor does he show how the model of inquiry instantiated by the method of natural philosophy makes relevant use of aspects of legal procedures. The connection between natural philosophy and the law is indirect, according to Gaukroger. They are both to be taken as paradigms of rhetorical reasoning (the law, more explicitly and more successfully; natural philosophy, less evidently so, without Bacon’s reinterpretation). Indeed, analogies between the two fields should not be overestimated. However, in the absence of an understanding of the influence of Bacon’s “legal” rhetoric on the shaping of philosophical method, we are left wondering why the law is such a powerful model for the latter, and such a rich reservoir of metaphorical language. Saying that law and natural philosophy can be compared because of their rhetoric still does not explain why the rhetoric of legal procedure can become the rhetoric of scientific method. Besides, exploring Bacon’s legal reasoning and language might be instructive also vis-à-vis the understanding of the psychology (or changing mentality) of the new natural philosopher. For example, Gaukroger explicitly follows Julian Martin’s analysis of Bacon’s legal views as in his (1992) Francis Bacon, the State, and the Reform of Natural Philosophy. Martin there points out (and Gaukroger mentions this) that the idea that Bacon had of a reformed legal practice can be better understood in the light of a hard-to-admit preference, on Bacon’s part, for some form of civil-law (rather than common-law) procedure. In fact, traces of both legal traditions (common law and civil law) can be found in Bacon’s writings on scientific method. What effect would this have on the shaping of the latter? What kind of natural philosopher did Bacon have in mind as the pursuer of the truths of nature? Would he be more like an accusatorial lawyer, or rather an inquisitorial judge? How about exploring, though carefully, a comparison between the psychology of the natural philosopher and that of an adjudicating civil-law judge? An indeed cautious investigation of legal analogies would, I believe, profitably serve Gaukroger’s overall project of unraveling the “psychology of knowledge” of the science-to-be.