Frank Cioffi: The Philosopher in Shirt-Sleeves

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David Ellis, Frank Cioffi: The Philosopher in Shirt-Sleeves, Bloomsbury, 2015, 189pp., $78.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472590114.

Reviewed by Tim Crane, University of Cambridge


Frank Cioffi, who died in 2012 aged 83, was an unusual and original philosopher, and by all accounts a charismatic teacher and conversationalist. Born in Brooklyn to a poor Italian immigrant family, he served in the US Army in its post-war occupation of Japan and came to Oxford on a GI scholarship in 1950. Having absorbed the atmosphere of Oxford philosophy at one of its high water-marks, he took a job at the University of Essex, where he worked until he retired in 1994.

The Philosopher in Shirt- Sleeves is a readable and affectionate memoir of Cioffi by a friend and intellectual companion who is not himself a philosopher (David Ellis is a retired professor of English literature). Every Sunday afternoon for twenty years he and another friend would visit Cioffi 'to converse or, more often, listen to what he had to say'. What Cioffi had to say must have been pretty good to command such sustained attention; and on the basis of this book the conversation does sound interesting, ranging widely and humorously over large questions about how to live and how to understand humanity. Cioffi had evidently acquired his ability to instruct and entertain from a young age: 'Get your ass over here and let's hear some of your bullshit' is how his fellow GIs would greet him in Japan.

Ellis does not himself attempt to expound Cioffi's published contributions to philosophy. Instead, an afterword by Nicholas Bunnin gives a lucid and informative description both of Cioffi's work and of the intellectual milieu of Oxford in the 1950s. Bunnin gives a sense of the excitement felt in Oxford in those times -- something brilliantly depicted some years ago by Jonathan Rée and again more recently by John Searle.[1] As Rée pointed out, the philosophers of that time were convinced that a revolution had taken place in philosophy; but they could not agree on what exactly it involved. Bunnin gives a nice account of how some of them thought that the problems of philosophy could be solved by the deft application of Frege's and Russell's logic, while others thought the key was the appeal to the ways we ordinarily speak. How remote and archaic this all seems now.

Cioffi drew on a somewhat wider range of intellectual references in his thinking than many Oxford philosophers did. He was interested in social science (Erving Goffman and what was right and wrong in his views seemed a particular obsession), in fiction and poetry, and he endeavoured to bring his reading to bear on philosophical questions. Ellis's book draws a picture of him as a man of strong opinions who could be as dismissive about some thinkers as he was enthusiastic about others. He seems to lack the dogmatism of many philosophers, however. Maybe this was because the later Wittgenstein was ultimately his strongest influence; and Cioffi is certainly one of the less dogmatic and inflexible of the many philosophers influenced by Wittgenstein. The attention to detail which is manifest in the conversations reported here might be seen as an extended elaboration on Wittgenstein's suggested Shakespearean motto for the Philosophical Investigations: 'I'll teach you differences'.

Cioffi is probably best known for his critique of Freud, which brought together his interest in the proper way to understand human life, his Wittgensteinian scepticism about generalisations, his sense of humour and his sharp eye for pretension and intellectual idolatry. Here is Cioffi writing in the London Review of Books in 1983:

Freud can connect anything with anything. This is Freud's explanation of why a young girl had to place all the clocks in her room, including her wrist-watch, out of earshot before she could go to sleep: 'The ticking of a clock is comparable to the throbbing of the clitoris in sexual excitation'. I have never known a woman who has not found this risible. And though Freud was a man of many parts, a clitoris was not among them.

Cioffi was unable to resist the many opportunities to make fun of Freud's more peculiar conjectures, and the apparent cheapness of his shots and the lack of respect shown to the Master infuriated the Freudian orthodoxy. Cioffi did not argue, as Karl Popper did, that Freud's work was unscientific because it was unfalsifiable; rather, he thought it had been falsified. The flaw in Freud's work was not that his theories failed to meet some pre-established standard of scientific acceptability. It was because they failed to make sense even according to the more familiar (but nonetheless sophisticated) standards of interpretative coherence which we apply in the understanding of one another. Cioffi conceded that Freud did have some brilliant poetic and rhetorical insights, but that (like Goffman) he dressed these up in a pseudo-scientific vocabulary in an attempt to generalise from very specific (and often over-interpreted) stories to grand and often bizarre hypotheses (e.g. the seduction theory). One aim of Cioffi's work on Freud was to explain why, in his view, there is no genuinely intelligible connection between the rather fragile evidence and these hypotheses.

Cioffi did not reject entirely the idea of a systematic understanding of human nature. Ellis writes that 'What helped to make Frank so interesting was the permanent battle that went on within him between a powerful will towards order, system, clarity of thought and delight in the sheer heterogeneity of human existence'. But his inclinations always drove him towards heterogeneity rather than system. The Sunday afternoon conversations touched on the nature of human achievement, the need to be recognised and valued, the limits of science and the meaning of literature. A dominant theme is biography, in the broad sense of what one should make of a life as a whole, either one's own or someone else's. Cioffi described Kierkegaard's famous saying that life can only be understood backwards as 'naively optimistic'; and to what extent an individual human life can be understood at all is a question which is approached from many different directions in this book.

No one answer emerges, but it is tempting to see Cioffi's concern with the nature of biography as not entirely impartial or purely theoretical. He seems very preoccupied with the application of these questions to his own life: how will he be remembered, how will his work be regarded, and so on. Cioffi comes across in this book as a generous-spirited, kind and warm person -- but somewhat self-absorbed and self-centred. Ellis comments at one point that Cioffi was 'not a particularly acute observer of how other people behave in public, judging them chiefly by how they had acted towards himself'. Elsewhere he remarks that Cioffi had a 'sense of never having had a success which was quite commensurate with his talents'. Perhaps these two facts are related; perhaps his self-centredness was part of what made him not quite achieve his potential as an academic. Or perhaps not. But what this book does show is that his talents were fully realised in his friendship and in his conversation. I never met Cioffi, but having read this book I wish I had.

[1] See Jonathan Rée, 'English Philosophy in the Fifties' Radical Philosophy 65 (1993); John R. Searle, 'Oxford Philosophy in the 1950s' Philosophy 90 (2015).