François Laruelle’s Philosophies of Difference: A Critical Introduction and Guide

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Rocco Gangle, François Laruelle’s Philosophies of Difference: A Critical Introduction and Guide, Edinburgh University Press, 2013, 190pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780826436634.

Reviewed by Antonio Calcagno, King’s University College, University of Western Ontario


One of the central debates in contemporary French philosophy consists of evaluating the viability and force of post World War II theories of difference, stemming from Nietzsche and Heidegger, and reworked in more recent positions developed by Derrida, Deleuze, Levinas and postmodern philosophers like Lyotard. Two key figures in this debate are Alain Badiou and François Laruelle. Both challenge the claims of an earlier generation that privileged difference as a response to what were perceived to be authoritarian, reductive and totalising modes of thinking. Rocco Gangle’s book helps readers navigate one of Laruelle’s more critical and important works on the aforementioned issue. The author of some 20 volumes, Laruelle remains a largely unexplored figure outside of French philosophy circles, although this is slowly changing as his works become available in translation and because scholars are seeking ways to comprehend and critique a substantive amount of French philosophy devoted to the question of difference, especially vis-à-vis problems in ethics, politics and metaphysics. Those familiar with Laruelle’s work will undoubtedly testify to its complexity, subtlety and difficulty, all the more reason why Gangle’s contribution is welcome.

Gangle’s guide opens with a brief introduction that situates Laruelle’s work, Philosophies of Difference: A Critical Introduction to Non-Philosophy, within his larger corpus, highlighting five significant periods of development. Gangle notes that though Laruelle’s text can be situated within a specific historical context, it is also relevant for later, more recent developments in Continental philosophy, especially theological and materialist interventions, because they are, in part, deeply influenced by an earlier generation’s work on difference. (14) He identifies eight chief claims of Laruelle’s book (21-22): there is a displacement of broad 19th century historical dialectic onto the 20th century discussion of difference after Nietzsche; the distinction between ‘syntax’ and ‘reality’ comes to define philosophy; difference is paradoxically understood as an ‘unengendered’ historical event and as an historically conditioned effect; difference takes on the status of a principle because it becomes more than just an instrument or means, and it is not seen to be one category among others while being articulated as being ‘for itself’ as opposed to being constituted with a context of relations; difference ends up repeating the Greco-Occidental problem of the unities of contraries, thereby implicitly invoking the One to resolve this problem; a methodological and thematic problem arises between plural philosophies of difference and the peculiar unity of the difference that structures them; philosophical decision will come to be seen as the invariable element in all of the philosophies of difference Laruelle will come to examine; the possibility of ‘real’ critique and non-philosophy exists.

Chapter Two of presents Laruelle’s general critique of recent philosophies of difference insofar as they reduce difference to a principle, which inevitably undermines their own critiques of western philosophy for being too reductive and totalising. But what is important in this chapter is the announcement of Laruelle’s own project. Distancing himself from Nietzsche, Deleuze, Derrida and Heidegger, he believes that one needs to think of difference, but not from the perspective of a foundational or grounding principle that we can generally call One, recognizing that the One, according to Laruelle, is named differently by the philosophers he critiques: Heidegger’s Finitude, Derrida’s différance, and Deleuze and Nietzsche’s understanding of difference as immanence. Laruelle wishes to discuss the possibility of an in-One of a generalising non-philosophy. What does this mean? According to Gangle, Laruelle proposes that difference does not lie in the opposition of two elements of a relation, but within their very relation:

Given any two terms, representing differentiated concepts, objects, philosophers, etc., the difference itself between A and B will be represented as A/B. Now the structure of (meta-) Difference may be expressed as follows: the difference itself between the two terms, in other words the entire complex term A/B, is to be distinguished in its own way from one of the two terms it already includes, and identified with the other. So, for instance, for the variable B in the expression A/B, we substitute the entire expression A/B, that is, the difference itself of A and B is distinguished from its own term, A. (35)

The problems with this kind of thinking become apparent, as Gangle notes at various points. Laruelle ends up instituting a foundational logic, but more importantly, he ends up repeating many of the problems that he criticises; for example, there is an immanence that arises from staying with the same two terms: no radical difference is announced, which we could symbolise with the introduction of a new different term like C. This, however, would be too reminiscent of the Hegelian Aufhebung that can produce new realities as it unfolds in history, which Laruelle claims recent French philosophies of difference wish to avoid lest they lapse into a totalising view of history and consciousness. For Laruelle, recent philosophies of difference become lodged in an understanding of difference that remains at a syntactical level or within the play of the meaning and use of words as opposed to “real” difference. What Laruelle means by “real” or “reality,” however, is not clear.

The third chapter provides a breakdown of Nietzsche’s understanding of difference as well as an analysis of one of his great contemporary interpreters, Gilles Deleuze. Gangle maintains that Laruelle's pairing of Deleuze and Nietzsche does not imply that their entire philosophical corpuses should be read as similar; rather, he sees both thinkers as indebted to an idealist dialectic when it comes to the question of difference; hence, the need to discuss them together. Undoubtedly, a binary logic permeates both philosophers. For example, we can think of the Deleuzean distinctions between the nomad and the royal, the rhizomatic and the arboreal, and the micro and the molar, as well as Nietzsche’s distinction between master and slave morality. And though both thinkers deeply undo Hegelian dialectic, Laruelle reads them as remaining indebted to a binary notion of difference that ends up ignoring the unique relations that lie in between the poles or end-terms of a given opposition, the in-One discussed earlier. Gangle writes,

Instead, Laruelle identifies the way the critical power of both their philosophies depends upon a transcendental decision for immanence that disallows not just the possibility of the real transcendence of finite, empirical objects, but of any real transcendence that would limit or qualify the creative-destructive power of Difference. . . . In short, Nietzsche-Deleuzean Difference ultimately situates the philosophical problem of reality only within the problem of philosophical syntax. . . . Nietzsche and Deleuze’s philosophies are ‘idealist’ for Laruelle only and exactly in this differentially articulated sense. (84-85)

Chapter Four turns to the work of Heidegger, examining his treatment of finitude. Laruelle admires Heidegger for his onto-theological critique of western philosophy, as it allows Laruelle to clear the way for his own reading of the in-One or the between-relations mentioned above. Gangle maintains that there are two distinct layers that constitute Heidegger’s analysis of difference understood as finitude.

the first stratum of Heideggerean Finitude, for Laruelle, consists of a lifting of the empirically derived notions of forgetting, inauthenticity and finitude to the a priori characterisation of philosophy as metaphysics. . . . This first level is . . . the dimension in which Heidegger delimits Western philosophy as metaphysics, or metaphysics as such. . . . the second stratum . . . [:] The tautological turn of Heidegger’s late thought allows this rigorously finite Finitude to be ‘let be’ (Gelassenheit) and thus to become minimally manifest (as essential withdrawal) without thereby determining any correlative and reciprocal syntax. (97-98)

Ultimately, Gangle notes that though Heidegger is the thinker who most closely approximates Laruelle’s understanding of difference, Heidegger cannot “manage to unveil a clear and visible alternative to the tradition he critiques.” (112) This may be true, if we read the unfinished Being and Time, but Heidegger’s later works certainly give us possibilities, which Laruelle does not fully explore here.

Chapter Five examines the work of Derrida on difference, and Laruelle here presents a classic critique of différance. In his analysis of western logo-centrism and onto-theology, Derrida argues that thought and language, and, therefore, being, are all deeply conditioned by spatialisation and temporisation that delay/defer meaning, not only resulting in meaning that constantly alters itself once it is articulated in given situations but also resulting in our inability to grasp absolutely the original sources of meaning though our own present-day contexts. But Laruelle, as Gangle rightly notes, does not wish to read Derrida as simply establishing différance as arch-structuring and, therefore, as totalising; rather, Laruelle sees in Derrida’s reading of difference an important difference between textual objectivity and textual operation. “Deconstruction treats this difference itself as one of its primary elements of deconstructive fracture and re-inscription. In other words, deconstruction is effected through a destabilisation of this difference as a fixed structure.” (139)

The final chapter of Gangle’s commentary focuses on Laruelle’s constructive philosophy. He tries to clarify what Laruelle means when he says that he advocates a non-philosophy that investigates the in-One. Again, the in-One refers to the in-between of elements in a relation that are no longer fully identical with the poles of the relation. (156) According to Gangle, Laruelle articulates two key concepts in the last chapter of Philosophies of Difference, namely, (non-)One and non-thetic transcendence (NTT). The former refers to

the aspect in which diversity or multiplicity appears when it is no longer structured through Difference, in other words when multiplicity or diversity is no longer conceived in terms any necessary relation between the multiple and One . . . . It is thus a kind of suspension of Difference with respect to or according to the One. (159)

I think of the Laruellian (non-)One as becomings without the necessary determination of a beginning or an end, a kind of in-process being. NTT explains how philosophy has traditionally presented the One either as transcendence or as transcendental. This classic interpretation also conditions how philosophy has viewed difference. If we read in-between relations, avoiding the absolutisation of determining elements as a specific a or b, we can undermine the authority that philosophy attributes to the unity/One of transcendence or the transcendental, understood either as ground, arché, unifying super-structure, being, mind or God, or the like. NTT allows for the transcendence of realities, but it does so from the standpoint of decisions to do so, rather than claiming there is a deeper, foundational ground or substance. Laruelle affirms freedom and decision-making as crucial to understanding the (non-)Ones of philosophical reflection.

In sum, Gangle shows us how Laruelle envisions philosophy as trying to understand reality in a non-metaphysical way and as a practice that is deeply conditioned by human choices and freedom as opposed to the claims of trying to know and justify what is. Laruelle’s language is difficult, sometimes obscure, and his formulations often puzzling, as Gangle rightly observes. Nonetheless, if we situate Laruelle’s discussion within its historical framework, we can certainly have a better idea of his project. Two problems confront Laruelle’s philosophy, and Gangle notes them as well. First, how does Laruelle’s non-philosophy avoid the same criticisms that he makes against Nietzsche, Deleuze, Heidegger and Derrida as well as Hegel and the German idealists? No matter how hard he tries, there always remains a soupçon of foundationalism in Laruelle’s project. Second, Laruelle’s discussion remains highly theoretical and couched within the logical frameworks of the thinkers he both admires and critiques. The power of Nietzsche, Heidegger, Derrida and Deleuze lies in the fact that they showed how their philosophies translated into real, concrete situations, events and objects: they brought their philosophies into dialogue with the events and situations of their day. This practical aspect is minimally addressed in the Philosophies of Difference, but it certainly can be found in other of Laruelle’s works . Supplementing the Philosophies of Difference with other Laruellian works would definitely assist readers in providing concrete examples of how Laruelle justifies his own non-philosophy.