Free Market Fairness

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John Tomasi, Free Market Fairness, Princeton University Press, 2012, 348pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691144467.

Reviewed by Andrew Koppelman, Northwestern University


John Tomasi offers a new synthesis of Rawlsian high liberalism and market-oriented libertarianism, which he calls "market democracy." It treats capitalistic economic freedoms as crucial elements of liberty, but demands that institutions be designed so that their benefits are shared by the least fortunate citizens.

Other political theorists, notably Gerald Gaus and David Schmidtz, have also emphasized the value of entrepreneurial activity as a moral ideal,[1] but Tomasi makes this his central focus. All three try to supplant Rawls with a more market-friendly, less welfare-statist vision. Tomasi's important work also inadvertently reveals the limitations of that vision.

Rawls's theory of justice needs adjustment, Tomasi persuasively argues, because Rawls did not appreciate the moral importance of markets. (175-76) "For many people, commercial activity in a competitive marketplace is a deeply meaningful aspect of their lives." (182) A society that seeks to facilitate the exercise of the moral powers ought to have a wide space for such activity. Rawls undervalues what people really care about.[2] Here Tomasi is a useful corrective to Rawls, who thought his theory indifferent between capitalism and socialism. The correction is largely of interest to specialists, however, since few left-liberals today are socialists, though Tomasi (270) thinks that the left "rejects market society and perhaps even capitalism itself."

Tomasi is not just a free-market critic of Rawls. He is also a Rawlsian critic of free markets. He shows that Rawlsian concerns about distributive justice are shared by even the most uncompromising libertarian thinkers, such as Herbert Spencer and Ayn Rand, both of whom argue that unimpeded capitalism will benefit the worst off members of society. (20) Some libertarians think that market distributions are just and ought not to be interfered with, but Tomasi follows Hayek in arguing that "it would be meaningless to describe the distributional patterns that result from market transactions as just or unjust." (152) Hayek denounces the idea of social justice, but by this he means government micromanagement of economic transactions, not considerations of distributional equity; he has no objection to a welfare-state safety net. (151-161)

At the deepest level, there is no disagreement between Hayek and Rawls. (157-60) This suggests the possibility of a middle ground. Free Market Fairness tries to delineate that ground.

Tomasi's book is a useful corrective to both Rawls and Hayek. Any liberal theorist who wants to build an account of economic justice on Rawlsian premises will have to take account of Tomasi. Any conservative who wants to invoke Hayek should recognize that Hayek offers no basis for rejecting redistributive taxation and expenditures. (Tomasi does not put it this way, but Hayek today would be on the far left wing of the Republican party.)

At the level of policy, however, Tomasi becomes vague and weak. Other than the rejection of some of Rawls's crankier suggestions, such as his embrace of worker cooperatives (an idea that hasn't had much appeal to actual workers) -- Tomasi's criticisms here are devastating -- the elevation of economic freedom to the level of a basic liberty doesn't entail much about the legitimate scope of regulation or redistribution. That would depend on how unregulated markets actually work.

Tomasi, however, repeatedly embraces poorly formulated, inadequately defended libertarian policy prescriptions. Thus, for instance, he invokes the right of each person to work "on terms that each chooses or accepts," (43) and thus offhandedly impugns antidiscrimination regulation of nongovernment jobs (109). A case for discarding the Civil Rights Act of 1964 will need more than a sentence fragment. He claims that citizens' self-respect is jeopardized by minimum wages, Social Security, and any government-funded medical care (84), though elsewhere (110) he concedes that wage and hour regulations should be permitted "in extreme cases." He is skeptical of the "various middle-class savings incentives," which happen to be the principal means, other than Social Security and Medicare, for keeping the elderly out of poverty (250-51).

Sometimes he concedes that economic liberty can't be absolute, but he insists that any restriction of it "must pass a high degree of judicial scrutiny." (91; see also 241) What such scrutiny would be looking for is unclear. He would apply it to "legislative proposals in pursuit of the social minimum," (92) which don't regulate anyone's economic activity. He thus conflates the role of the judiciary with the question of what liberties are actually possessed by citizens. The United States today has a very high degree of economic liberty that receives hardly any judicial protection. If something is "a highly valued part of a just society," he claims it should "require . . . basic protection." (181) But as he himself emphasizes with respect to the social minimum, whether a system reliably delivers a good is a different question from whether there is a formal institutional mechanism that guarantees that good. There is no strict scrutiny of regulations that impede access to food, such as zoning laws that stop supermarkets from opening on residential streets, but most Americans still get enough to eat. An enhanced judicial role also has costs. His proposal for judicial review of economic legislation "bears some similarity to" pre-New Deal American jurisprudence. (117) That was no great bargain for the actual liberty of American workers.[3]

He declares that "the institutions of European social democracy are a gilded cage," (113) but he does not pause to describe any of the cage's bars. "Social democratic regimes affirm ideals of slow or zero economic growth." (254) Which ones? He claims that "the service programs of many social democracies" are "so burdensome that they impinge on the responsible self-authorship of citizens," (94) but he doesn't explain which programs he has in mind or how they do this. If economic opportunity is important -- and it is -- then it is relevant that relative economic mobility in the United States is less than in Denmark, Norway, Finland, Canada, Sweden, Germany, or France.[4] But perhaps what matters is not the upside, but the downside: America's working poor who support their families "are doing something genuinely important with their lives," and they would lose that status if they are "assured that they and their children will be well provided for whether or not they themselves contribute." (80) Is social democracy defective because it adequately supports its children?

The fuzzy metaphor of a small state can easily produce the delusion, one that unfortunately is becoming increasingly influential, that it is market-friendly to mindlessly cut the public payroll. Tomasi is sometimes skeptical even of environmental laws, noting that the voters who support such laws "typically do not have the information they need to make rational decisions about the environment." (259) His answer is accountability: "the farmer is more accountable with respect to his field than is the politician in whose general jurisdiction that field lies." (260) Absent regulation, however, the farmer is not accountable for negative externalities caused by pesticides or genetically modified seeds. Tomasi's formulation overlooks the possibility that voters, aware of their own limitations but concerned about pollution, might reasonably want to empower specialists, such as the staff of the Environmental Protection Agency, to make such determinations.

A market democratic regime will "provide for a small number of genuinely public goods." (230) But there are hardly any of these: roads and bridges are "perhaps" legitimate activities of market democratic regimes. (108) He worries about the abuse of government power "If national artistic, cultural, and scientific foundations are to be run by governmental appointees," (252) but he offers no evidence that the National Science Foundation and the National Institutes of Health have been thus corrupted.

Tomasi is right that Rawlsian high liberals owe "a moral explanation of how . . . narrowing of private economic liberty enhances the status of persons as responsible self-authors." (82) But there is a standard response, having to do with familiar forms of market failure from which no amount of individual initiative can protect us. His ideal does not disable the government from preventing pollution and fraud.

Tomasi uncritically accepts the public choice critique of the regulatory state, which predicts that regulators will be captured by rent-seeking interests, to the detriment of public welfare. (199-203) That is why he is so eager to find market-based alternatives to the state. But that critique is manifestly contradicted by the facts, notably the fact that the air you're breathing and the water you're drinking are both cleaner than they were when the Environmental Protection Agency was created in 1970. In fact, the administrative process insulates regulators from political pressure in numerous ways, and beneficial regulations have been enacted over the protests of both the President and Congress.[5] If you're worried about capture, then libertarianism carries its own dangers. There are plenty of unsavory interests that would be pleased if we did away with the EPA.

Of course, capture does sometimes happen, and it needs to be fought. Left and right should unite to get rid of farm subsidies! But as long as government has legitimate responsibilities, the task of cleaning out such rot must be done at retail, one law at a time, not by wholesale attacks on government. You don't treat a pimply face by amputating the patient's head.

Then there's distributive justice. Tomasi adopts something like Rawls's difference principle, but wants to deliver its benefits without a large role for the state. He proposes "economic growth as an antidote to the problem of worker vulnerability in postindustrial societies." (110, also 188) According to the Congressional Budget Office, between 1979 and 2007, real income for the top 1 percent of American households grew by 275 percent. For the 20 percent with the lowest income, it grew by 18 percent. During the same period, the share of total market income received by the top 1 percent of the population grew from about 10 percent to more than 20 percent. The share of the bottom 20 percent of the population fell from about 7 percent to about 5 percent.[6] These inequalities developed during a period of enormous growth. Growth won't fix this.

Market democratic regime types make little room for the legislative programs by which social democratic regimes typi­cally pursue social justice: aggressively redistributive taxation, state-based social service programs, extensive public regulation of the workplace, and such. (216)

A great deal turns on what "little room" and "and such" amount to. At one point he claims that "market democratic regimes provide no institutional guarantees that wealth will in fact come into the hands of the poor, much less that the other requirements of social justice be met." (195) Trickle-down is all that the folks on the bottom can hope for. But: "Like social democratic regimes, market democratic regimes can include a con­stitutional guarantee of a basic income or safety net." (230) He is torn.

Tomasi is right that in recent years the political consensus about left liberal institutions has collapsed, producing the new politics introduced by Ronald Reagan, whom he quotes with approval. (197, 139-40) But we are also told that fair equality of opportunity "requires strong public funding for schooling in the hope of thereby delivering equal educational opportunities for all." (239) Federal college aid for low income students has been massively cut since Reagan.[7] My parents couldn't afford to contribute a penny to my college tuition, but I had the good sense to graduate in 1979. Today I would probably have had to yield my admissions spot at the University of Chicago to someone dumber but richer, or else graduate with crushing debt.

Rawls's insensitivity to the moral virtues of markets, so well anatomized by Tomasi, entails little about his theory of justice, because his theory doesn't exclude market capitalism and so can easily incorporate it as an element. It is entirely compatible with the regulated capitalism that exists in all industrialized democracies. Libertarianism, on the other hand, demands radical change, of a kind that would empower the economically strong and crush the economically weak. Its vision of a just society is not liberalism at all, but rather resembles its ancient adversary feudalism, in which parties trade their allegiance for protection by the powerful.[8] Rawlsianism is necessarily at war with this. It isn't possible to bring the likes of Ayn Rand into the liberal coalition. Tomasi's desire to find a middle ground between these views thus repeatedly brings him to incoherence.

This incoherence mirrors that of contemporary American conservatism, which ritually recites the Rawls-Hayek safety net idea while working assiduously to transfer wealth from the poor (by cutting social programs) to the rich (by cutting taxes). Tomasi, who sincerely cares about the well-being of the worst-off, nonetheless finds himself supporting this brutal (and, he has shown, not really Hayekian) program, because like many other Americans, he distrusts the state. Whether that distrust is justified is an empirical question.

Another empirical question is whether human beings are as Tomasi imagines them. He thinks that high liberals such as Rawls "tend to emphasize the importance of the status of citizens over that of their agency," but that a market-oriented liberalism is a "more inspiring ideal." (265) But there are limits to the efficacy of individual agency in an unregulated market. Telling everyone to buck up and cope is no more appropriate in an unregulated market than it is in an emergency room. Agency matters, of course, but democratic regulation is also a form of human agency.

Tomasi may respond that he is offering no policy prescriptions, but merely setting forth an aspiration, one more attractive than social democracy, even if there are practical obstacles to its realization. (264) But his casual rejection of so much of the modern state, and his embrace of wreckers like Reagan, is not so insulated from practical politics. Ideals can be dangerous if too far removed from the realities of human life. Wouldn't it be nice if markets produced no failures and injustices, so that state intervention wereunnecessary. But compare this logic: in an ideal society, we would all be immortal, with the bodies of the Greek gods; in such a society, we would never get sick; therefore, there is something unjust about publicly funded medical care. The law against murder insults citizens by presuming that they are vulnerable. And so forth.

Liberalism doesn't necessarily entail much about either regulation or redistribution. The questions that determine liberalism's entailments are going to be resolved, not at the level of political philosophy, but at the level of empirical description: does an unregulated market create transaction costs, externalities, market failures, inequalities of wealth beyond those necessary to create incentives for growth, etc.? To the extent that you think the answer is no, then liberalism will entail a small state. To the extent that you think that the answer is yes, then liberalism will entail a big state.

[1] Gerald Gaus, The Order of Public Reason: A Theory of Freedom and Morality in a Diverse and Bounded World (Cambridge University Press, 2011); David Schmidtz,Elements of Justice (Cambridge University Press, 2006).

[2] I have made an argument similar to Tomasi's, focusing on sexual rather than market activity. Rawls's conception of the self is too thin to give adequate weight to either. Andrew Koppelman, "The Limits of Constructivism: Can Rawls Condemn Female Genital Mutilation?", Review of Politics 71: 459-482 (2009). This also produces insensitivity to other goods, such as those associated with religion. Andrew Koppelman, Defending American Religious Neutrality (Harvard University Press, forthcoming 2012).

[3] See William E. Forbath, Law and the Shaping of the American Labor Movement (Harvard University Press, 1991).

[4] Pew Charitable Trusts Economic Mobility Project, Economic Mobility: Is the American Dream Alive and Well? 9-10 (May 2007).

[5] An invaluable corrective here is Steven Croley's careful delineation of the political dynamics of federal administration (and devastating critique of the public choice theory) inRegulation and Public Interests (Princeton University Press, 2008).

[6] Congressional Budget Office, Trends in the Distribution of Household Income Between 1979 and 2007 (October, 2011).

[7] See Michael S. McPherson & Morton Owen Schapiro, The Student Aid Game: Meeting Need and Rewarding Talent in American Higher Education (Princeton University Press, 1998).

[8] Samuel Freeman, "Illiberal Libertarians: Why Libertarianism is Not a Liberal View," Philosophy and Public Affairs 30: 105-151 (2001). Tomasi thinks that the idea Freeman attacks, of property as morally absolute, is "so obscure it is difficult to judge whether any libertarian actually affirms it." (50) But the basic idea is simple: any taxation for purposes of redistribution violates the property rights of the taxed, and so is absolutely barred. Tomasi does not endorse that idea (though he is mighty uneasy about redistribution), but many libertarians do, most prominently Robert Nozick.