Free Time

Placeholder book cover

Julie L. Rose, Free Time, Princeton University Press, 2016, 169pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691163451.

Reviewed by Eric Rakowski, University of California at Berkeley


Liberal egalitarian theories of distributive justice focus predominantly on what it means for a society to treat people as equals in allocating material resources and discrete opportunities, such as the chance to obtain an education, to secure employment, to buy insurance, and to participate in civic life. They tend to say nothing directly about the time people have available to pursue ends they choose. Julie L. Rose's book spotlights this omission. Her specific concern is free time, defined as "the time beyond that which it is objectively necessary for one to spend to meet one's own basic needs, or the basic needs of one's dependents, whether with necessary paid work, household labor, or personal care." (58) Rose argues forcefully that free time ought to be regarded as a separate and vital resource or opportunity, alongside money and other goods that figure prominently in theories of justice, because it is "an all-purpose means in precisely the same way as income and wealth." (67) She further attempts, less persuasively in my view, to draw out the implications of assigning independent importance to the distribution of free time in regulating work hours or assisting providers of dependent care.

Rose begins by lamenting how hard -- and unhappily -- Americans work. Many log more than a standard 40-hour week and over a third do some work on weekends. Survey respondents claim that they would prefer to spend more time with friends and family. Night shifts, mandatory overtime, competition for bonuses, and costly childcare add to the collective dissatisfaction. Although Rose's philosophical arguments bear examination on their own, it seems worth noting her announcement at the outset that "the extent to which many people today have little free time" is the "motivation" for her book. (14) Running throughout is a hankering for an idealized middle-class life in 1950s America shorn of gender and racial inequalities, with safe day jobs for all who want them and Sundays off for nearly everybody.

It is fair to ask what the costs of realizing that vision would be and whether enough of us would want to pay them. The United States has twice as many people as it had sixty years ago, with congested urban centers that benefit from staggered work schedules. Two-earner families are common and often desired by both partners, for self-fulfillment as well as for material means, and flexible evening and weekend hours are a boon to many. Property prices in the choicest areas, not to mention salaries in many industries, are increasingly driven by international monetary flows. If American auto workers are unwilling or not allowed to work at night while their Korean counterparts pull three shifts, or if American software engineers start leaving the office at 5 pm, capital investment and jobs will tend to migrate abroad in the absence of protectionist measures, with ramifying effects on our economy and standard of living. To be sure, a lot depends on issues that Rose flags but does not take a firm stand on, such as whether employers should be permitted to pay workers more if they labor overtime or at inconvenient hours, or on whether people should be allowed to work longer or earn above a certain amount if that pressures others to toil more than is essential to meet their basic needs. (That Rose considers these serious questions says a great deal about her normative commitments.) And a tremendous amount turns on tax and government spending policy, which Rose does not address. Nonetheless, for all of its commendable analytic precision, an undercurrent of what some will see as anti-liberal disapproval of economic or professional striving runs through the book and shapes its account of what justice requires.

Why have liberal egalitarian theories of distributive justice couched their operative principles in terms of resources or opportunities or capabilities while ignoring free time? After all, the hours we do not spend sleeping, doing housework, buying essentials, and earning enough "to attain a basic level of functioning" (58) in our society are when almost all of what we really care about occurs. Rose attributes this neglect in part to philosophers' confusing free time (as she understands it) with leisure, which liberals are apt to see as a specific good, one that plays a more or less significant role in different people's conception of a valuable life, rather than as a resource of universal utility. In the chapter she calls "the book's normative core" (5), however, Rose offers a different and more appealing explanation. Liberal egalitarians, she thinks, assume that if money, opportunities, or other resources are distributed justly, everyone will have plenty of time left over to spend as they like, whether in play, additional work, civic or religious activity, or whatever else matters to them. The main thrust of the book is to show that what Rose calls the "time-money substitutability claim" is false and that therefore "free time must be treated as a distinct object of distributive justice." (75)

The claim is false because it rests, Rose says, on two further assumptions, both of which are false. The first key assumption is the "perfect divisibility of labor demand: all individuals can freely choose to reduce their hours of paid work to the level they prefer." (77) This assumption is empirically untrue in contemporary America. Most employees cannot decide to work shorter hours if they like for reduced pay; jobs often specify work hours with little or no leeway, and a variety of factors push employers to demand more rather than fewer hours from their workers, often in the form of nondiscretionary overtime. This may not tell against a work-unconditional theory of justice -- like universal basic income accounts -- but it does undermine work-conditional theories, Rose contends.

This is a pillar of Rose's overall argument and it warrants more discussion than is possible here. Whether job types, normal working hours, and other economic variables would closely resemble ours in a just state is unclear. One might also feel unease about Rose's motivating example, which seems to assume that workers are not responsible for where they live, which skills they have developed, or which jobs they accept. If, however, a sizable group of people were unable to find jobs that left them with sufficient free time despite government transfers and wage subsidies, Rose's claim about the independent significance of free time within a theory of justice (that did not incorporate a universal basic income) would have weight. Maximum hours laws and overtime regulation might be justified on this basis.

The second assumption that undergirds the time-money substitutability claim, according to Rose, is that "all individuals can unobjectionably meet their household and bodily basic needs by purchasing goods or services in the marketplace." (81) She thinks this proposition is false for two reasons. First, money cannot buy people whose special needs are extremely time-consuming to satisfy all the free time to which justice entitles them. This may well be true, but so far as I can see neither Rose nor any other liberal egalitarian can solve the problem. Some people cannot be leveled up fully at acceptable, or any, cost.

Second, "for a range of other necessary activities, it is indeed true that one can substitute income for time engaged in meeting one's household and bodily basic needs -- either directly by hiring someone's services or indirectly by purchasing a good -- but it does not follow that a theory of justice is entitled to assume that citizens should make such a substitution." (83) Under some social circumstances, Rose says, hiring somebody to help meet one's household or bodily needs poses a threat to civic equality. Even when those (unspecified) circumstances do not obtain, "citizens may reasonably believe that hiring the services of another to meet their household and caregiving needs may undermine the personal goods of commitment and intimacy in their relationships, degrade the value of the labor itself, or injure their own personhood." (83-84)

Rose says that it is beyond the scope of her book to say when these concerns are legitimate. I found the omission puzzling. If they are illegitimate, then her objection to the second assumption founders, which seems ample reason to pursue the point. And if these concerns are legitimate, one wonders what follows, especially if one accepts, as Rose does for the sake of argument here, that citizens are unconditionally entitled to a basic income. Her lone example involves a woman with arthritis that requires 20 hours per week of physical therapy. She also spends another 30 hours per week caring for her elderly mother. Even with a basic income and no paid employment, she lacks her fair share of free time, Rose says. But how will making free time a distinct object of concern from the standpoint of justice help in this situation? Her arthritis will not disappear and Rose says (one might disagree) that helping to care for her mother instead of allowing her mother to use her own basic income for that purpose does not count as a voluntary use of her free time. On Rose's assumptions, it seems she is simply stuck in an unjust situation. Whether money and time are fully interchangeable seems irrelevant.

The last third of Rose's book attempts to sketch some of the implications of weighing free time against other items of distributive concern, such as money and opportunities, in setting social policy.

For free time to be useful, at least a significant portion of it must be made available in a way that allows people to engage in shared social, civic, religious, or athletic activities. One way this could be accomplished is "to guarantee citizens vast amounts of free time, say, eighty hours of free time per week." (99) Rose acknowledges, however, that providing a universal basic income that offers abundant free time to all may not be economically or politically feasible. A second way is to give workers "complete discretion" over their working hours. This, too, is likely to prove impractical. A third way, however, to which Rose is powerfully drawn, is to enact "Sunday free time" laws.

Rose recognizes that such laws trammel economic liberty. If people want to have Sundays (or any other day) free to spend time with others, they need only decline jobs that would require them to work then. The market can allocate work times and pay rates according to people's preferences for shared time and economic rewards. Rose rejects this line of reasoning. Her main concern -- here and throughout most of the book -- is not with self-employed people who choose to work on a society-wide rest day, but with employees who she believes might be pressured to work when they would rather be doing something else. In her view, effective freedom of association has priority over economic liberty, which means that protecting the vulnerable takes precedence over the autonomous labor decisions of those who are more financially secure. Rose's preferred solution is to proscribe paid employment on Sundays except for narrow categories of employees. As for those who would have to labor on Sundays anyway -- police, nurses, childcare providers, transport workers -- they should do so voluntarily or on a shared rotation, she says, and employers could be prohibited from inquiring about someone's willingness to work Sundays or from providing a higher salary or benefits to those who do, to further protect a person's right to effective freedom of association. (106 n.24) Would enough people be willing to do the jobs Rose considers essential if bonuses for Sunday work were not permitted? I suppose they might if those jobs carried a mandatory rotation and if the pay rate was high enough, but that is likely to cost our society more than providing overtime bonuses only to those who want the extra work.

Rose further maintains that those who care for children, the elderly, or the disabled free of charge should be compensated, because they perform a public service. The time they devote to this task reduces their free time, which a just society must make up to them in some way. I found myself unconvinced by Rose's brisk defense of this claim. In a just liberal egalitarian society, elderly or disabled people who need assistance would presumably have insurance or other resources (such as a basic income) available to pay for care. It is not clear why their children, say, should be able to claim compensation from the state for the loss of their free time if assistance can be furnished more cheaply or efficiently through other institutions than by their children. It is also not clear why those who are helped should not be charged (if they received a basic income or were insured) to reimburse the state for any compensation it then provides to their caregivers.

As for the time that biological parents spend providing necessaries to their children, Rose recognizes that some liberals believe that children "are personal projects like any other, and parents have no more claim to additional public support to pursue their particular conceptions of the good than do any other citizens." (120) She herself, however, endorses, without offering new arguments for, the opposing claim that children are public goods; in fairness, she says, those who benefit from their existence should contribute to the cost of bearing, raising, and educating them. A great many issues go unexplored here, such as what portion of the cost of raising children is properly borne by the community if most of the benefits redound to parents, or why the benefits that children confer on others when they are grown should be paid for by other adults when they are minors instead of by those (and only those) who receive those benefits later, or why a ready supply of working-age would-be immigrants does not transform childbearing and childrearing from a public service into something more personal. Rose's aim is to draw out the policy implications of the assumption that children are public goods, rather than to solidify the arguments for that position.

Not surprisingly, she concludes that parents who choose to engage in full-time caregiving are entitled to income subsidies and state-provided child care (to give them their fair share of free time) and that those who engage in full-time paid work are owed subsidized or publicly provided child care. She also contends that parents must be given a third option: "to engage in significant amounts of both paid work and direct caregiving, while having free time." (124) To deny them the time and resources for direct caregiving would be to deprive them of one of their legitimate interests in having children. But to consign them to full-time caregiving would effectively be to deny them occupational choice, Rose says. "Providing this option requires a set of workplace accommodations for parents, including periods of paid leave, extended short-hours schedules, and flexible work hours." (126)

Rose says in her conclusion that what constitutes a fair share of free time depends on numerous factors, such as how wealthy a society is, which distributive principle applies to people's resource claims, and how free time should be valued in a given society by comparison with other goods. Although she does not name a number, several of her examples suggest that she thinks that 56 hours per week, or on average 8 hours a day, is roughly what justice requires in the United States today. One of her key assertions is that "the claim to free time justifies regulations that protect citizens' ability to choose to spend no more time meeting their basic needs than is necessary to have their fair share." (138) She defends maximum hours laws and restrictions on overtime work, and while she generally favors allowing people to use their free time to work longer and earn more money, she argues that extra work might have to be prohibited "if the desire of some employees to work longer hours undermines, through competitive pressures and social norms, the ability of other employees to choose not to work longer hours." (138-39) How this principle might be applied to students who are preparing to become employees or employees who are studying on the side to get ahead, let alone assistant professors of philosophy seeking tenure, is a mystery. We currently assign many jobs and social rewards meritocratically. If those who chose to use their free time to excel were denied advancement on the basis of their greater acquired ability, our world would look very different -- poorer, less exhilarating, less excellent, if in some ways more equal.