Free Will: A Guide for the Perplexed

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T. J. Mawson, Free Will: A Guide for the Perplexed, Continuum, 2011, 196pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441102096.

Reviewed by V. Alan White, University of Wisconsin-Manitowoc


Reading the last few pages of Mawson's paean to agent-causal libertarianism, one question grew in my mind like kudzu to overrun any other garden-variety observation that I might open my review with: when does one philosopher's scrupulously crafted philosophical retreat become another's wildly failed apologetic rout? Now I want to be clear that I do not mean that Mawson sees himself in this work as beating anything like retreat in defense of his view; rather, he sees agent-causal libertarianism as more like the last noble knight triumphantly standing in the jousting arena of vanquished free will-position peerage. However, I think that Mawson is in this respect closer to a Quixotic assessment than a realistic one, and I will argue that his overall tactic is in fact one of retreat and best seen as part of a grander tradition of apologetic flight started a couple of generations ago and continued today by what I'd dub collectively a lam of libertarians. I will also stipulate, however, this lam -- and Mawson's effort is exemplary -- is to be respected generally for clarity, intellectual vigor and honesty, and stalwart conviction. In my judgment they are just in the end most likely wrong, that's all.

Should one think I am a bit harsh in my tone here, partly it is due to my equal-but-opposite reaction to the force of the second of Mawson's two objectives for the book as it affects the first. The first is that the book is meant to be a moderately sophisticated introductory-level work, aimed at (but not restricted to) someone previously engaged with the topic at an elementary undergraduate level (this is the avowed purpose of Continuum's "Guide for the Perplexed" series), and thus it surveys most current scholarly stances on free will, and as it turns out often very cleverly well. The other objective is that Mawson defends a particular free will position. Of course Mawson is not the first to attempt this double-duty even with respect to the same issue; for example, Ted Honderich's How Free Are You? sets similar goals but with respect to defending his revisionist account of the free will problem. However, I'd contrast both of these efforts with, for example, Robert Kane's A Contemporary Introduction to Free Will, which is at least as good as Mawson's and Honderich's in achieving this advanced-introduction goal while avoiding expository imbalance, even though Kane in that work is as obviously an event-causal libertarian as Mawson is an agent-causal one. Introductions pedagogically are obligated to something approaching a comprehensive but even-handed treatment of the field if that is their primary goal. My review is thus partly skewed by displeasure that Mawson's occasionally forced pressing of his second objective doesn't square with this standard, and I do not think genuinely "perplexed" readers are best served with his overall approach. Readers are of course free (in some sense) to disagree.

Mawson's layout for the book is straightforward given his objectives. After an interesting thought-experiment ("Introduction") where the reader is invited to wonder what it would be like to become a member of a society where a pill would grant maximal happiness at the sacrifice of self-determination, he offers a defense in the rest of the book of libertarian incompatibilist pronouncements about choice and responsibility anchored in the truth of indeterminism and the need for ultimacy of responsibility tied to indeterminism (thus entailing the falsity of compatibilism).

Mawson's defense is based on five propositions, each claimed to be a folk desideratum of free will, which collectively comprise a libertarian outlook. They are:

1. Sometimes I could do something other than what I actually do.

2. Sometimes I'm morally responsible for what I do.

3. If I couldn't do other than what I actually do, then I wouldn't be morally responsible for what I do.

4. If I wasn't the ultimate author of my actions, then I wouldn't be morally responsible for them.

5. To the extent that I did not will an action under the morally salient description, I am not fully morally responsible for it.

Though Mawson claims that these are "thoughts that people ordinarily have" (p. 6), in a lengthy endnote (p. 35 n. 14) he allows that it is "an empirical matter whether or not the majority do start off as incompatibilists or compatibilists." While he recognizes the role that experimental philosophy -- X-Phi -- might play in nailing this down, he also criticizes the methodology of results obtained thus far in this effort (especially as those results favor compatibilism). His basis for sticking to his version of folk-claims is explained in his main text as "over 15 years of discussing this subject with my students … though these results were not, I confess, collected with a very rigorous methodology." (p. 34)[1] I grant that some of Mawson's concerns about X-Phi might be well-founded, if sketchy. Still, that is a far cry from establishing a reasonable basis for claiming that his "thoughts" 1-5 are so well-founded among the folk as to be the concrete foundation for a book-length libertarian construction project. But people do sometimes build on speculation, so I will simply say that I regard 1 and 2 plausible as folk beliefs indifferently by incompatibilist and compatibilist lights, 3 more questionably as a folk belief, 4 contentiously so, 5 again plausibly so by both incompatibilism and compatibilism[2], and thus I move on to Mawson's defense of these as specifically libertarian.

Mawson narrowly defines "incompatibilism" to be the incompatibility of moral responsibility with the truth of determinism rather than the more familiar use of the term as the incompatibility of free will with the truth of determinism (pp. 55-56). He justifies this definition as better for assessing the "dialectical balance" (p. 55) of incompatibilism against compatibilism since some more subtle views (such as John Martin Fischer's semi-compatibilism) could then be grouped with the latter (p. 57).

Adopting a legal analogy, Mawson then argues that folk-belief favors the "innocent until proven guilty" (p. 61) status of incompatibilism as a "basic belief" (pp. 58-59). Thus he claims that 1-3 start out as basic folk beliefs and are "properly" innocent if justificatory arguments are available for them (pp. 58-60), and consequently it would be the uphill task of compatibilism to prove itself against them. But clearly what Mawson takes as a basic belief is something like a received belief that functions well enough in everyday contexts as not to require further analysis or justification (see his math example, pp. 59-60). He allows that those who maintain a contrary basic belief in compatibilism would reverse the terms of the legal analogy (p. 64). I've mentioned above the dubious status of claim 3 as a folk belief; X-Phi already has something to say against it, even as Mawson admits (p. 179 n. 23). Oddly, given his confident assertion of 1-3 as basic beliefs, Mawson then concedes that if incompatibilism does not have "trumping arguments" against compatibilism there "is no general truth about where the burden of proof lies then, just particular ones for particular people" (p. 64). I thus find this whole epistemic itinerary unnecessarily serpentine. I fail to see how the legal analogy tied into the issue of properly basic beliefs advances our understanding of the dialectical balance between incompatibilism and compatibilism, and Mawson should just simply stick to assessing which position has an overall argumentative edge.

Clearly Mawson thinks that incompatibilism does have that edge. The main reason is the "consequence argument" (CA), which argues from (i) we cannot change the past and (ii) we cannot change natural laws and (iii) if natural laws are deterministic the present is the necessary consequence of (i) and (ii) that (iv) we thus cannot change the present (p. 65). (I would have preferred another version of the CA but no matter.) Mawson takes the unalterability of the past and the laws as obviously true in this case, and he focuses his efforts on defending "Rule Beta", which of course is Peter van Inwagen's rule of inference that allows so-called "transfer of powerlessness" from (i) and (ii) through (iii) to (iv) (p. 68). Over the span of many pages (pp. 65-92) and clear and ingenious examples, Mawson shows that classic compatibilist efforts to grant (i)-(iii) while holding (iv) false by the so-called "conditionalist" refutation of Beta fails. He spells out how compatibilist counterfactual power-attributing conditionals like "If Tanya had chosen to stand up, she could have" fail to address whether the antecedent could be satisfied in a deterministic world, thus robbing the consequent's palpable truth of force against Beta. One strong support offered by Mawson for this is an interesting argument that any actual deterministic world is logically hemmed in only by nearby counterfactual indeterministic worlds (pp. 82-85), blocking compatibilists from claiming that Tanya's counterfactual choice would indeed be deterministic. Along with this he characterizes any attempt by compatibilist determinists to deny the truth of (i) or (ii) as "ridiculous" (p. 85). Mawson believes the CA thus escapes unscathed from classic compatibilist attacks.

The moves here are a bit too quick. He leaves it mostly to endnotes (n. 14-16) to reject summarily an influential account (due to David Lewis but astonishingly not so ascribed) of "local miracle" counterfactual ability that salvages compatibilism in the face of the CA, and doesn't bother at all to mention recent efforts by Humean compatibilists to make the denial of (ii) consistent with determinism.[3] Since his discussion is otherwise painstaking, surely these are pretty significant oversights. Beyond that I note Mawson's failure to allude to the fact that van Inwagen himself rejected Beta for a revised version that has more dubious modal strength than the original.[4]

Leaving the CA behind, Mawson then confronts the challenge of psychologically content-descriptive compatibilist and semi-compatibilist views mounted against folk claim 3 (pp. 92-106). As his treatment of this rather rich contemporary literature on Frankfurt-style examples, reasons-responsiveness, tracing, and so on is brief -- and in my view dismissively so -- let my criticism also be brief. Much more needs to be said than that a mental-state indeterministic "flicker of freedom" libertarian strategy suffices to dispose of most of these challenges (p. 104). Specifically, it's unclear how such a minimalist form of indeterminism under conditions of overdetermination of an agent's action adds anything substantial to a libertarian account beyond what otherwise constitutes necessary conditions of moral responsibility such as rationality, lack of coercion, etc., that psychologically structural "actual-sequence" compatibilist views endorse. What is clear is that Mawson believes that such "flickers" can provide for ultimacy of responsibility in a way compatibilists can't. I'll return to that issue below. Finally, Mawson completes his discussion by somewhat curiously arguing that even divine necessity of action does not show incompatibilism is false.

Mawson then moves on to show that indeterminism is plausibly true, thus combining with incompatibilism to produce a positive position on free will rather than some negative "determinism al dente" ala Derk Pereboom. Though in the end he pronounces belief in indeterminism "vindicated" (p. 142), that claim is finally due to a similar track of argument about the "innocent-till-proven-guilty" status of incompatibilism. Thus parsing folk claim 1 as the strong subjective impression that alternative real -- not just epistemic -- possibilities are available to us in choice, Mawson claims that this is another instance of a basic belief that favors indeterminism (pp. 114-115).

I actually tend to agree with him here that this claim is widely held -- certainly more so than in the case of his claim 3. Were we to ask people if they could have put down a book five minutes ago that in fact they did not, Mawson is right that many people would react by putting the book down and assuming that if they could do so now, why not then? (Mawson's example, p. 115) However, it is certainly conceivable in this case that this is due to a conflation of what is really possible with what's epistemically possible (as Mawson observes, p. 12). Mawson doesn't think so in this case, as well as in most common deliberations about action, and that's his privilege (pp. 13-14). But there are instances of widespread "common sense" beliefs -- about the flatness of the earth, the inferiority of certain classes of people, and, an example Mawson himself uses, that witches exist -- that have turned out to be false. The vexing overlap and often slim difference between what is really possible and what is easily logically conceivable conceal distinctions most people are not well-equipped to appreciate, and the slide from counterfactual conceivability to accessible reality is all too easy and even comforting ("Hey, I could easily have done that if I wanted to!"). So although people do have a basic belief like 1 that seems indeterministic in meaning, it could be just pervasive bewitching ignorance at work (tweaking Mawson's witch example, p. 139). Nonetheless, Mawson tendentiously brands it indeterministically "innocently" true, and the determinist must adduce evidence to show otherwise (p. 114).

Of course, that's not easy to do. The chapter devoted to this issue -- "Indeterminism" -- is the most solid one in fairly sorting out the empirical mess here, discussing the current embrace of indeterministic interpretations of quantum theory, the Libet experiments on choice, the compatibility of determinism with change and unpredictability in chaotic systems, and so on. Charitably, in the end Mawson allows that determinism isn't quite dead as a plausible view of the world, and forthcoming evidence might revive it (pp. 134-136).

One head-scratching analogy alluded to above comes near the end of the chapter. Stating incompatibilism as "If we are sometimes morally responsible for our acts then indeterminism must be true" and asserting folk claim 2 -- "We are sometimes morally responsible for our acts" -- as another properly basic belief, then Mawson concludes that "indeterminism must be true" (pp. 136-140). Now of course Mawson takes incompatibilism "proved" by his previous chapter as basic belief 3; here he attempts to back the basicality of 2 by comparing its ubiquity as a belief with the old-fashioned popular belief in witches(!). He argues that even in the face of someone among such a witch-believing community boldly claiming that no witches exist, "the villagers are in fact reasonable [his emphasis] in persisting in their belief that there are witches unless or until they are presented with reasons for abandoning that belief" (p. 139).

Certainly in some communitarian sense of approval the villagers may be "reasonable", but if that is all that is meant by "basicality" of belief, then I'd say so much the worse for what appears here to be an epistemological term founded on ad populum. Mawson does say that belief in moral responsibility is more akin to properly believing that "some people are accountants" rather than that some people are witches (p. 140). (I'll withhold arguing any coextension here.) But clearly (at least to me) the strong claim that people believe that some are morally responsible in the specific sense that incompatibilism requires is not as demonstrably widely held as is the weaker claim that people believe that some are morally responsible in some sense. It is only the former strong claim that can be used in the modus ponens above to argue for indeterminism -- not the latter. That strong claim is certainly debatable, and more grist for the X-Phi mill.

The last substantive chapter ("Ultimate Authorship") defends folk claim 4. As mentioned earlier, this is the most contentious as a tenable folk claim, and for reasons linked to my comment immediately above. People do tend to think of themselves as responsible beings and the author of their acts in most such instances. Whether they tend to think in terms of ultimacy about their authorship is doubtful, however. Beyond the fact that they hold that some acts are truly theirs and not someone else's, I wonder whether people then draw conclusions from that fact about "buck-stopping" authorship of the type needed for the agent-causal view. Again, we seem to need more X-phi work here.

This chapter fills in the blanks for how just a "flicker of freedom" is sufficient to blunt the force of Frankfurt-style examples. Mawson holds that there are two kinds of causes in the world -- event causation and agent causation (p. 162). Event causation is that of ordinary physics, either necessitating or probability-raising effects from causes (pp. 144-148). Agents are subject to event causation but, depending on circumstances, to different degrees. When operating rather automatically on "auto pilot" (p. 162) we find that we as agents are subject to pure event causation due to the type of behavior our formed personality tends to exhibit in a kind of situation. But when we deliberate in a careful, "non-rushed" and non-coerced way (the essence of claim 5, pp. 154-155), mental state events causally incline us probabilistically in certain ways for good or ill, but they do not in such cases "always fully necessitate what we end up doing" (p. 147; his emphasis). Here Mawson argues that agential causality may come into play. Up to the moment of a certain decision -- whether of great moment, such as cheating on taxes (pp. 144-148), or a more trivial "Buridan's ass" choice of a type of glass for beer (pp. 159-160) -- the final choice is thus undetermined and free (presumably in an opportunity sense). It is then left to the agent to add what Mawson calls agent-causal "oomph" (p. 144) to finalize it as a free decision (presumably in an ability sense). That addition of agent-causal "oomph" to the decision-making process at that particular time constitutes the "buck-stopping" libertarian lynchpin of ultimate authorship responsibility. Thus in Frankfurt-style examples of external overdetermination of an action, Mawson would hold that the overdetermining circumstances are rendered morally otiose by the agent's "oomph" actually luckily going the intended direction of those circumstances. Though those circumstances would have kicked in with the appearance of opposing "oomph", they did not. But the agent was capable at that time of producing opposing "oomph", though in fact the agent did not.

Mawson does not commit to the ontological status of agents as either substantivally distinct from events (as "souls", for example) or emergent "top-down" causal entities constituted by events but not causally reducible in their powers to that of their constituent events (pp. 163-166). He also maintains that this account does not produce a new account of causation, but only introduces a new relatum into the picture -- the agent as cause of events as actions (p. 165). The fact that this agent-causal relation would entail at least dual effects as possibilia is noted (literally so, p. 165 n. 29), but not seen as problematic (though unexplained in note 29), perhaps based on the probability-raising model of event causation. But this doesn't address the further problem that the probability-raising concept of causality is compatible or co-extensive with a luck-infected indeterministic concept of causality as well. That doesn't bode well for an agent-causal sense of control of effects, as van Inwagen has argued.[5]

Lastly, in keeping with the theme of the basicality of claims 1-5, Mawson asserts that our powerful introspective sense that we are agents trumps any prospect of reducing our actions to a purely event-causal account down the road (pp. 166-168).

The deliberate pace of this crucial chapter is belied by the fact that its footnote apparatus is by far more involved than any other. Important critical and explanatory matters are too often relegated to superscript. (In defense of Mawson, Continuum counsels authors that in this "Perplexed" series extended discussion of secondary sources should be suppressed. So much I'd say for heavily titrating introductory zeal against reflective caution in the delicate chemistry of controversy.[6]) It's also unclear to me how repeated reference to "oomph" (really? "oomph" as explanatory?) based on introspective appeal makes for a clear and convincing case for libertarianism, agent-causal or event-causal.[7] Of course I seem frequently to cause my actions -- who would think otherwise? But that hardly serves as justification for a specific metaphysics of this phenomenon, and Mawson fails to show convincingly that (e.g.) semi-compatibilism cannot account for what should be taken as "ultimate authorship" in a way that satisfies common notions of what it is to be a proper subject of blame or praise, yet preserves this subjective sense of agency.

Finally, I must return to my opening remark in this review formed on this last part of the book.

Beginning with C. A. Campbell in the 1950s [On Selfhood and Godhood], contemporary libertarians -- the "lam" as I've somewhat derogatorily collectively branded them -- have clearly embraced a form of retreat in defense of that view. Campbell (as far as I can tell) was the first to declare that there was "a comparatively narrow area" of morality that was in need of libertarian salvation. He focused on "duty versus desire"-type decisions, claiming only those were essential to a libertarian account. Subsequent naturalist (and even empirically savvy supernaturalist) libertarians have narrowed that even more to, for example, instances of self-forming actions (which Mawson seems to endorse) that reduce the position to depending on a smattering of crucial decisions across the span of our moral lives, leaving the vast remainder subject to causality. I think that's clearly in response to a steadily growing scientific literature that shows that human nature and action is overwhelmingly a function of biological mechanisms that only very arguably could be influenced by anything like quantum processes -- and then only by sheer chance. The other option is a libertarian supernaturalism of agency, which of course has its own crosses to bear. Libertarianism is in full retreat from the empirical evidence even if it is indeed abetted by popular "basic belief" opinion. (Want to canvass the popularity of creationism? Oh X-Phi of free will despair!) Mawson's book is pointedly symptomatic of this state of affairs despite its elegantly confident libertarian tone.

[1] In my own very spitball methodology of researching this issue over 25 years, where I simply asked cold-turkey in a brief writing assignment during the second class-meeting what students think "free will" means, I can report that over half -- well over in particular classes -- say "I can do what I want" or "no one tells me what to do" and the like. While not inconsistent with incompatibilism, these ordinary language reports (I would say) favor compatibilism right out of the linguistic chute because they typically don't refer to mental acts of choice. And, since this question was asked of my introduction to philosophy students, and I've had a lot of them (averaging 50+ students a semester), that represents a database of somewhere over 2500. So my idol in my own case does not quite resemble Mawson's with respect to conviction about the "obviousness" of libertarianism with the folk.

[2] Mawson defends claim 5 mainly in terms that are not contentious for anyone concerned about moral or even legal responsibility (pp. 45-49), and so it is not pivotally controversial either in the book or my review. But I do wonder if the folk would so easily assent to it as phrased here.

[3] Helen Beebee and Alfred Mele's "Humean Compatibilism," Mind 2002.

[4] "Free Will Remains a Mystery", Philosophical Perspectives 2000.

[5] In the latter part of "Free Will Remains a Mystery".

[6] Perhaps this helps explain the further fact that the index to the book is one of the least useful I have seen in a scholarly work. On the other hand, physically the spine on this book is downright unbreakable, and maybe that makes up for it in terms of search-intensive thumb-ability.

[7] I take it that this is a by-product of the fact that libertarian control appears to be "black-box" unanalyzable. It can't reduce to physical causality, yet it must anchor ultimacy. Blest be the indeterministic ties that bind -- just not too loosely or tightly.