Free Will, Agency, and Meaning in Life

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Derk Pereboom, Free Will, Agency, and Meaning in Life, Oxford University Press, 2014, 219pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199685516.

Reviewed by David Shoemaker, Tulane University


This is basically a new and improved version of Derk Pereboom's important Living Without Free Will (2001).  In the thirteen-year interval, his skepticism about free will has been the subject of lots of critical scrutiny (with over 600 citations). Pereboom has taken this scrutiny seriously, and in this book he lays out a refined version of his view designed to beat his critics back and expand the view in several ways. In many respects, he succeeds. It is hard to imagine a more rigorously defended articulation of free will skepticism. At the end of the day, there are still some avenues of resistance, but Pereboom has made it much harder for the non-skeptic to find them.

Pereboom's version of skepticism is called hard incompatibilism, according to which the type of free will necessary for moral responsibility of the basic desert-entailing kind is incompatible with determinism, and we lack any good reason to believe that its indeterministic conditions obtain. Consequently, many of our responsibility responses -- including some reactive attitudes, punishment practices, and relationship presuppositions -- are unjustified, and so ought rationally to be altered. Nevertheless, Pereboom's optimism remains, for even if we ought to give up lots of these attitudes and practices, there are other attitudes and practices compatible with his skeptical conclusions that may take their place, and substituting them will contribute to our living in a better world and finding meaning in life.

"Basic desert" is essential to Pereboom's account. It is thought to apply to a type of responsibility known as accountability -- the label I will use from here on out -- which has to do with living up to the demands we place on one another. To be accountable for an action requires being able to exercise control over it in a way that makes various kinds of treatment -- resentment, sanctions, rewards, etc. -- deserved full-stop, i.e., as a sole function of one's having "performed the action, given an understanding of its moral status, and not . . . merely by virtue of consequentialist or contractualist considerations" (2). This basic desert-entailing type of control is what Pereboom means by the "free will" we do not have.

The master argument gains steam throughout. In Chapter 1, Pereboom defends his view of what such free will would have to look like. Rather than requiring the availability of robust alternative possibilities -- leeway -- it merely requires that the agent be the source of her action in some way. Pereboom leans on the "Frankfurt cases," as do many others, to establish this point, and he defends his view from several leeway theorists, sometimes with the help of Carolina Sartorio's important recent work.

In Chapters 2 and 3, he investigates three libertarian accounts of sourcehood free will -- event-causal, non-causal, and agent-causal -- all of which he finds wanting. The first two are problematic in light of his "disappearing agent" objection, according to which there are insufficient contributions by the agent on these views for her to count as settling which decision occurs in a way that she can be its (accountable) source. Agent-causal views, on the other hand, do have a sufficient role for agents -- it builds them right in from the get-go -- but Pereboom views the prospects of this form of libertarianism to be dim insofar as our best physical theories give us very little reason to believe that we are such agents. I find his arguments in all three of these first chapters to be careful, subtle, and, with very minor quibbles, exceedingly plausible.

Chapter 4 takes on the most widely-held account of sourcehood free will and accountability -- compatibilism -- and argues against it by deploying an updated version of Pereboom's justly famous four-case manipulation argument. Case 1 describes an agent, Plum, who is manipulated by a team of neuroscientists into killing White. The newly described form of manipulation needs to be made explicit:

[The scientists] do so by pressing a button just before he [Plum] begins to reason about his situation, which they know will produce in him a neural state that realizes a strongly egoistic reasoning process, which the neuroscientists know will deterministically result in his decision to kill White. Plum would not have killed White had the neuroscientists not intervened, since his reasoning would then not have been sufficiently egoistic to produce this decision. (76-77)

Plum is stipulated to have all the conditions various compatibilists have required -- e.g., a functional reasons-responsive mechanism, harmony between first- and second-order desires, lack of compulsion or external coercion -- and then he goes on to kill White. In Case 2, the team of neuroscientists program Plum at the beginning of his life so that his reasoning will be strongly egoistic at the time necessary to get him to decide to kill White; in Case 3, he is indoctrinated to be this way by his community; and in Case 4, he is this way due simply to the causal determinacy of the universe. If, as is supposed to seem intuitively plausible, Plum is not accountable for killing White in Case 1, and there are no relevant metaphysical differences between Cases 1-4, then he cannot be responsible in Case 4 either, and compatibilism is false. Being causally determined to do something by factors beyond one's control -- the relevant feature common to all four cases -- undermines accountability. Incompatibilism must be true, therefore, but as there are no plausible libertarian accounts of free will, it is quite unlikely that we have it.

Pereboom has made some important refinements to his cases in light of 0objections and commentary, so the argument is now even harder to wriggle out of. Nevertheless, let us try wriggling by starting with a possibly relevant difference between Case 1 and the rest. There are two features operant in typical manipulation cases, namely, the fact of the manipulation and its content. Suppose the neuroscientists are able to predict with 100% accuracy when Plum's neural state will realize the strongly egoistic reasoning process sufficient to get him to kill White. When that state is about to occur, the scientists, just for fun, beat it to the punch by producing an exactly similar state a moment in advance. Plum then kills White, which is just what he would have done had the scientists not interfered. I suspect that now many might think Plum is accountable (or it will be far less clear that he is not). If so, then what does the heavy lifting in Case 1 is the replacement of Plum's neural state with a different state, and not the fact of manipulation as such. As such replacement does not obtain across Cases 2-4, different reactions to them may be warranted.

In response, Pereboom would point to the fact that we are influenced to reason egoistically or morally all the time by various external factors, including other agents. As he notes, "Finding out that the home team lost can cause one to reason and behave more egoistically and less charitably, and news of winning a prize stands to make one reason and act more generously," (76) without, we suppose, undermining either agency or accountability. So claiming that I would have done X if not for my attention being brought to Y does not of itself preclude my being accountable for doing Y rather than X, so it should also not matter for Case 1 (or constitute a relevant difference across the cases).

Perhaps. But note that for many of us the sorts of influencing factors we suppose are compatible with accountability are only those that produce actions that are still in -- or at least not radically out of -- character. We tend to be skeptical that Patty Hearst, e.g., was (fully) accountable for helping to rob that bank, given her genteel character. Generating intuitions of agency without accountability thus requires positing manipulation so radical that it gets the agent to decide to do something distinctly out of character, something that that very agent would not have done in ordinary circumstances, even with the familiar external influences at work.

Of course, we need to know what character is to know whether an action is out of it. Pereboom claims he has constructed his case so that Plum's action is in character, "since for Plum it is generally true that selfish reasons weigh heavily" (75). But that some types of reasons tend to have a certain weight is only one (formal) feature of character; another, more central feature, is what the content of one's (egoistic and moral) reasons is, i.e., what it is, precisely, that they counsel. These content features are the most relevant to what we think of as character, and they tend to be the reasons generated by our cares and commitments, the things that matter to us.

What I'm saying, then, is that more details about who Plum is are needed in Case 1, so that we can determine whether the facts about what he would have done constitute a relevant difference between Case 1 and the rest. In particular, we need details about the content of Plum's egoistic reasons, that is, what they are reasons in favor of doing, and how these reasons are connected up to his antecedent and persisting values and cares. But filling in such details spawns a dilemma. Either Plum's killing White is in character or it is not. If the latter, if, that is, he is a gentle creature, whose strongly egoistic reasons typically favor only bringing about the pleasure he gets from cuddling with his dog, but who also sees absolutely no value in, nor cares about, physically harming anyone, then we may agree with Pereboom that Plum is not accountable for killing White. Plum is an egoistic jerk sometimes, but he's no killer. But there is no "alternative" Plum in Cases 2-4, someone who would have done a different in-character thing if not for some deliberative replacement, so such an assessment does not transfer over to them, and that means there is a relevant difference between Case 1 and the rest.

Alternatively, if Plum's killing White in Case 1 is in character (as it seems to be in Cases 2-4), that is, if it is the kind of thing we always expected Plum would do, given how much he talked about hating White and how he killed white rats in preparation, then, contrary to Pereboom's claim, I suspect we would tend to view Plum as accountable after all. On this construal, what the scientists do is just like the kinds of ordinary "nudges" that get us to see the salience of certain factors here and now that also antecedently matter to us. But if Plum is accountable in Case 1, there is no reason to think he is not accountable as well across all the cases.

The first horn of the dilemma presents what's known as a soft-line response to Pereboom, as it pushes accountability for only some of the cases. The second horn presents a hard-line response, which maintains the possibility of accountability for all four cases. The best version of that response is Michael McKenna's, and Pereboom discusses it at length. Here a very interesting, and typically ignored, methodological question arises, namely, to whom are we addressing these sorts of arguments-by-cases, and what would count as success for them? McKenna urges that we are addressing a confirmed agnostic about moral responsibility, who could start with Case 4, respond intuitively that it's not clear there that Plum is not responsible, and then, given the "no difference" arguments of Pereboom, wend her way back to its not being clear that Plum is not responsible in Case 1 either. Pereboom's reply is that the proper starting rational attitude is that of the neutral inquirer, who starts off as an agnostic in Case 4 but allows that "adducing an analogy for which one's intuitions are clearer might itself count as the relevant sort of clarifying consideration" (94) sufficient to get this inquirer to revisit and revise her initial reactions to Case 1. Regardless of who is right here, the methodological question is of great importance, and failure to be clearer on the answer has surely contributed to many dialectic stalemates over the years. I admire Pereboom for taking it up.

In the last half of the book, Pereboom shows what the practical implications of his free will skepticism would, and would not, be. Chapter 5 argues that a belief in determinism does not undermine the presuppositions of rational deliberation, which just requires a kind of epistemic openness, in tandem with a certain sort of belief that one's deliberations will be effective in action.

Chapter 6 argues that, while accountability is implausible, other kinds of moral responsibility are not threatened by free will skepticism, so while the reactive attitudes somehow presupposing basic desert are out, other "responsibility-ish" attitudes are still in. The main negative attitudes Pereboom thinks ought to be jettisoned are moral resentment, indignation, and guilt, as these include a cognitive component, "a belief that the agent deserves to be the target of . . . anger just because of what he has done or failed to do" (128). If Pereboom is right, those (many) of us who continue to resent others are irrational, as no one meets the metaphysical conditions for basic desert. But such skepticism does not preclude judgments of people's goodness or badness, or various responses to people's poor judgments, responses to both of which have a forward-looking aim, namely, to influence people to do well/better in the future. And when it comes to responding to ill will, we still have an arsenal of non-basic-desert-compatible attitudes, e.g., disappointment, hurt feelings, shock, concern, and sadness. Indeed, making these changes could make for a better world, as anger often destroys relationships and fuels conflicts.

I have some doubts. First, although talk of resentment and indignation has its obvious source in Strawson, Strawson himself did not mean these to have the cognitive component assumed by Pereboom (and many others). Rather, as John Deigh (2011: 212) points out, resentment, for Strawson, is merely an emotional response to one's discernment of another's ill will toward one, and neither the discernment nor the response requires any cognitive propositional content. Sulking children thus may resent their parents, even if they lack thoughts about desert, wronging, or blame. If so, resentment and indignation may not be irrational in the face of free will skepticism.

But even if we grant Pereboom the cognitive content of blame, the need for basic desert could arise only in virtue of its anger component, of which resentment and indignation are merely "cognitively sharpened" (D'Arms and Jacobson 2003) instances, and not in light of a mere thought about wrongness (which is a judgment, not a treatment). But there is a gap between anger's fittingness and the kind of "deserving" retributive blame Pereboom associates with accountability.

To explain, anger at the ill will of other agents, unlike Pereboom's substitutes, seems to have a distinct communicative aim, namely, to express a demand that the offender acknowledge what she did. Indeed, without such acknowledgment, none of the forward-looking benefits of Pereboom's substitutes would be possible. But acknowledgment itself is distinctly backward-looking, requiring the offender to take up the perspective of the offended party in a way that allows her to feel what it was like for that agent when she injured him. Once she returns to her own perspective, that feeling typically transmogrifies into guilt, which then paves the way for the possibility of forward-looking forgiveness, reconciliation, and moral improvement.

This anger may be expressed in all sorts of ways, only some of which involve retributive harm. When I clench my jaw, walk out of the room, throw my hands in the air, quietly shut the door on you, or even yell at you, the aim is not necessarily to harm you in any way. Yet in these examples it does not feel as if there is any component of my anger that has not been discharged. Consider two cases of angry, retributive responses to your injuring me. In the first, I cause your downfall without your knowing I had anything to do with it. In the second, I cause your downfall but I make it known to you ("This is for what you did to me!"). In the first, some aspect of my anger feels thwarted, whereas in the second, nothing is. Only in the second was anger's communicative aim met.

Retributive harm thus seems merely to serve the communicative aim of anger, but if that fundamental aim needs no retribution to be fully discharged, and if only retribution requires basic desert, then (fitting) anger as such does not presuppose basic desert. Now how one expresses one's anger might presuppose basic desert, but that is a different matter, involving a decision about what to do in light of one's antecedent anger-blame. Indeed, it could be better overall for us to eliminate anger from our repertoire, but if so, it would be for moral or prudential reasons, not metaphysical ones.

In the final two chapters, Pereboom discusses how free will skepticism would impinge on criminal responsibility and meaning in life. Retribution in the criminal law is certainly much more thoroughgoing than it is in interpersonal morality, and so it may be that my suggestions above are irrelevant for criminal responsibility. Punishment is clearly harm, so justifications for it "must meet a high epistemic standard" (158), and the standard -- basic desert -- may be higher than we can meet, given free will skepticism. What Pereboom advocates instead -- again, refined in light of objections -- is detention on the model of quarantine, which is justified by (forward-looking) self-defense.

In the last chapter, Pereboom takes on the worry that if the power to affect the future is no longer ours, as free will skepticism seems to imply, then such skepticism saps the meaning from life. Further, if the central Strawsonian reactive attitudes are no longer justified, wouldn't interpersonal relationships be undermined as well? Once again, Pereboom argues that most of these important things in life can survive free will skepticism. Even if love makes us vulnerable to resentment, we could still "take measures that would result in the substitution of disappointment and sadness for resentment" (184). When it comes to guilt and repentance, we could substitute "deep sorrow and regret" (186). And when it comes to meaning in life, there are still plenty of positive responses compatible with skepticism, such as a true sense of accomplishment upon the achievement of our goals.

Pereboom is advocating a massive rewriting of human sensibility based on theoretical arguments that are, as he allows, not decisive (178). Now when it comes to harsh treatment of others, he may be right that the strength of his metaphysical arguments "provide[s] a sound moral reason to treat wrongdoers as if the skeptical position were true" (178; emphasis mine). But a "better safe than sorry" argument like this feels less gripping when applied to the sorts of positive treatment -- often flowing from loving relationships -- that are also ruled out to the extent they presuppose basic desert. Indeed, now it looks as if the argument may have more power in the other direction: to the extent these relationships are exceedingly valuable, render us vulnerable to a wide range of attitudes, and would take significant work to revise, "better safe than sorry" may counsel revisiting and rewriting the skeptical theoretical arguments, or at least their practical implications. There may thus be an asymmetrical payoff to revisionary metaphysics like Pereboom's, giving us reason to revise our practices only in the negative cases.

This book is state of the art, and it should be taught widely (advice I will take myself). My objections do not reflect at all on its quality; rather, they reflect only my own scrappy efforts to escape Pereboom's increasingly sophisticated net.


The author is grateful to Michael McKenna for discussion of some of the issues in this review.


D'Arms, Justin and Jacobson, Daniel. 2003. "The Significance of Recalcitrant Emotions (or, Anti-Quasijudgmentalism)." Reprinted in Anthony Hatzimoysis, ed., Philosophy and the Emotions, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).

Deigh, John. 2011. "Reactive Attitudes Revisited." In Carla Bagnoli, ed., Morality and the Emotions (Oxford: Oxford University Press), pp. 197-216.