Free Will and Action Explanation: A Non-Causal, Compatibilist Account

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Scott Sehon, Free Will and Action Explanation: A Non-Causal, Compatibilist Account, Oxford University Press, 2016, 239pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198758495.

Reviewed by Ishtiyaque Haji, University of Calgary


Against the causal approach to analyzing human action and to explaining instances thereof, in Part I of his excellent book Scott Sehon defends an approach in which actions are to be explained teleologically, in terms of goals or purposes toward which the actions are directed. Candidate reason explanations, he proposes, are to be judged on the basis of three primary considerations: whether (i) agents act in ways appropriate to achieving their goals, given their circumstances, epistemic situation, and intentional states; (ii) these goals are of value to the agent; and (iii) the facts constitutive of (i) and (ii) support pertinent counterfactuals. For example, if an agent was directing her behavior, B, toward goal G, other things equal, if in her circumstances achieving G would have required behavior C instead, she would have engaged in C. (28). Sehon argues that teleological explanations cannot be reduced to causal explanations. In addition, his account is normative because it entails that some behavior is an action if it is rationalizable: it is in accord with the agent's plans and goals. The extent to which an agent's behavior is rationalizable corresponds to the extent to which the behavior counts as a goal-directed action. To the degree to which a piece of behavior is not rationalizable, it fails in that degree to be an action; and, "if something systematically fails to exhibit rationalizable behavior, then, to that extent, it fails to be an agent" (43).

Six chapters comprise Part I. Chapter 2 is devoted to formulating and explaining the teleological account. Chapter 3 attends to objections spurred by the normative component of the account that the degree to which some behavior is rationalizable and some entity is an agent may vary with rationality. Chapter 4 deals with other objections, including the objections that there are behaviors that are teleologically explicable but, intuitively, aren't actions, and that the account leaves unanswered what constitutes a truth-maker for teleological explanations. Chapters 5-7 seek to undermine the causal approach. In particular, in Chapter 6 Sehon argues that proposals to solve the problem of causal deviance that plague causal accounts fail, as do prominent proposals to reduce teleological explanation to causal explanation. Chapter 7 exposes another putative problem with causal accounts: if such accounts are true, common-sense psychology would be committed to claims about the nature of the mental to which it is not in fact committed.

In Part II, Sehon explains and defends a version of non-causal compatibilism. Reminding us that goal-directed actions just are teleologically explicable or rationalizable actions, he proposes that "free actions = actions for which we are responsible = intentional actions = goal-directed actions" (130). Sehon then argues that in virtue of its implication that the causal history of an action is irrelevant to its being free, the teleological account escapes traditional worries about whether determinism or its falsity threatens free action or moral responsibility. The guiding idea is simple: prominent arguments for the incompatibility of determinism with free action or responsibility, and rival compatibilist views, either implicitly or explicitly rely on the assumption that the correct account of reason explanations is some variation of the causal account. But the teleological rival undermines this assumption.

Five primary chapters comprise Part II. Chapter 8 exposes the basic tenets of Sehon's non-causal compatibilism ("NCC"). Chapter 9 responds to objections to NCC that question its implication that behaviors that are less than fully rational, such as akratic or immoral behavior, are, hence, less fully cases of action, and thus less free. Chapter 10 continues this defense by addressing unusual or relatively rare cases such as Frankfurt cases and ones involving psychopaths, coercion, and brainwashing. Chapter 11 explains why NCC undermines arguments for incompatibilism. Chapter 12 attempts to show that NCC enjoys an epistemic advantage over libertarian rivals, such as Robert Kane's event-causal view, and compatibilist competitors, such as John Fischer and Mark Ravizza's reasons-responsive view. Unlike NCC these other views fail to satisfy element (c) of the following constraint: either (c) necessary conditions for free will must be consistent with our ability to judge, with reasonable justification, that ordinary adults in mundane circumstances meet these conditions, or (d) accept that, for practical purposes, ordinary adults in commonplace circumstances fail to act freely and are not responsible for their actions (195).

The book is wonderfully written, meticulously organized, carefully argued, richly informed by the relevant work of others, and philosophically rigorous. Part I is a sustained defense of teleology and criticism of causalism. Part II carves out a new position among compatibilist contenders.

Turning to some critical discussion, Alfred Mele challenges the teleological account with this case: sometimes when Norm is about to engage in ordinary behavior, such as climbing a ladder to fetch his hat from the roof, Martians first read his mind to determine what he intends to do. In Case 1, having discerned Norm's intention to climb the ladder, they E-manipulate him -- they paralyze his body with just the right sorts of electrical jolts to move his muscles and joints in relevant ways. If the Martians detect any sign that Norm is about to change his mind, they relinquish control, and Norm reverts to his usual self.[1] It appears that (a) on the teleological account, since Norm's behavior is in accord with his plans and goals, it is rationalizable and so counts as action. However, (b), since the Martians control his body, he is not acting at all.

Sehon rejects (b). One of his chief reasons is that "we would hold Norm fully responsible if his behavior had moral significance" (imagine that he was about to squeeze a trigger to kill someone), and "this is evidence that . . . [his] behavior . . . is an action" (59). But appealing to moral responsibility is a double-edged sword: We would not believe that Norm is responsible for the trigger's being squeezed if we fail to believe that this event is an action.

Another reason Sehon advances to discard (b) appeals to an example that is relevantly like Case 1 but in which it is clear, he says, that the agent's germane bodily movements are actions. Doctors install a microscopic gadget in Jane's paralyzed right index finger. By sending electronic signals to this gadget, they can make it move in all the ways in which Jane could previously make it move. The doctors also install another device in Jane's brain that detects when Jane is about to move her index finger. The device relays this information to a computer, which then sends appropriate signals to her brain that result in her finger being moved in just the way in which Jane had planned (60). Sehon's verdict is that we would not "treat Jane's finger-related behaviors any differently than her other actions" (61). This judgment can be resisted. Jaya cannot translate any of her intentions into bodily movements because of some neurological disorder. Nerves to apt muscles in her body are incapable of stimulating these muscles or otherwise initiating the sort of movement she would have made had she been able to execute her intentions. A contrivance, similar to the one in Jane's brain, sends apt signals to a computer that then brings about movement in her body via stimulating microscopic aids installed in her body where needed. The event that is Jaya's hand's rising when it is, roughly, the computer that makes her hand rise in response to being activated by Jaya's intention to raise her hand, seems not to be an action. If one has this intuition -- one believes that the computer brings about hand movement -- then one should have an analogous intuition about Jane's finger-related behaviors: they are not actions. Jaya acts in forming the intention to raise her hand but one may reasonably deny that she acts when the computer causes her body to move in various ways.

Sehon discusses a modification of Case 1 that I proposed in which the Martians intervene even before Norm has acquired any desire or formed an intention to climb the ladder. After paralyzing Norm's body, they E-manipulate his body to climb the ladder. In this case (Case 2), Sehon is willing to grant that Norm is not acting when he climbs the ladder. But he thinks that now, (a)—that since the teleological account implies that Norm's behavior is in accord with his overall psychology, it is rationalizable and, hence, is an action--is false. Suppose Norm has no current thoughts about climbing the ladder. When the Martians E-manipulate him, he would be alienated from his behavior and he would be baffled and amazed at what he found his body to be doing -- walking toward and climbing the ladder (63). This would be so even if the Martians manipulated him only instants before he would have decided to climb the ladder on his own. The proposal that Norm is acting for the purpose of climbing the ladder "does not make good sense of his bafflement and amazement at what he finds his own body to be doing" (63). Since attribution of this goal to Norm fails to make Norm turn out to be adequately rational, he does not have this goal, and his behavior is not rationalizable.

Regarding bafflement, our own behavior may often surprise us but still be rationalizable. Deep in thought about Sehon's insightful remarks about Norm's case, I find myself in the kitchen. When it strikes me that I'm by the stove, I'm amazed. But knowing me so well Shaheen isn't. It is the aroma of her freshly baked cookies that rationalizes my behavior.

To the objection that Norm lacks the relevant goal, consider yet another modification, Case 3. Norm desires to climb the ladder and also desires to clean the garage. Unlike Case 1, he has not yet formed an intention to climb the ladder but shortly will if left to himself. Before forming this intention, the Martians E-manipulate his body to climb the ladder. The E-manipulation will cease instantly if Norm displays appropriate cues. Since Norm does desire to climb the ladder, he has the relevant goal, and his behavior is in accord with his overall psychology. Hence, (a) is true. We would expect Sehon to deny (b) in this case because he denies (b) in Case 1. The teleological view, then, implies that Norm acts even when the Martians take over his body. But we now have a puzzle: How can the mere inclusion of a desire to climb the ladder transform Case 2 from a scenario in which Norm's behavior is putatively not rationalizable into one in which (Case 3) it is? Specifically, when Norm has this desire, his behavior is in accord with his overall psychology, but when he lacks this desire as in Case 2, his behavior is not in accord with his overall psychology. If we knew enough about the psychological life of Norm, as the Martians do -- for example, we knew that Norm detests leaving things out of place, he has a very strong disposition to safeguard what he really likes (he's very fond of his hat), and so forth -- and we knew that if left on his own, he would eventually form the intention to retrieve the hat (partly on the basis of acquiring or strengthening the desire to retrieve the hat), and then execute this intention, it would seem that his behavior in Case 2 is no less rationalizable than it is in Case 3, if his behavior is, indeed, rationalizable in Case 3.

According to the truth-maker objection, the teleological theory neglects the metaphysical question of what constitutes a truth-maker for teleological explanations (66). Here's a way, certainly not novel, to interpret this objection. Joe cranks up the volume of his radio. Why did he do so? Maybe he wanted to annoy his wife or scare the cat. Suppose his behavior was directed to one of these goals. Which one? Sehon's proposal is that relevant counterfactuals will settle the matter. He explains:

Since there are no bare counterfactuals, by virtue of what do these counterfactuals hold? What fact grounds the truth of such counterfactuals? But just as I said that teleological facts are the truthmakers [they need not be reduced to anything non-teleological], I would also say that the relevant counterfactuals are grounded in the teleological facts. (66)

But there is a nagging problem here. Trying to figure out why Joe turned up the volume, suppose we ask what he would have done in a nearby world in which his wife was out shopping. Imagine that he would still have increased the volume. Maybe Sehon's position is that the truth of this counterfactual (and pertinent others) gives us reason to believe that Joe really wanted to scare the cat. However, that this counterfactual (and numerous others pertinently like it) is true is consistent with its being the case that Joe raises the volume to annoy his wife. The truth of this counterfactual seems to depend on what reasons Joe had to turn up the volume. If this is so, the relevant counterfactuals are not grounded in the teleological facts.

Regarding the putative immunity of the teleological account from determinism's threats, reflect on Mele's Ann/Beth case (2006, 165).[2] Beth is a far less industrious philosopher than Ann. Wanting more production out of Beth, the college's dean enlists the help of neurologists who implant Ann's values in Beth. These implanted values are unsheddable for Beth: given her psychological constitution, ridding herself of them is not psychologically feasible under any but extraordinary circumstances. The manipulation turns Beth, in relevant respects, into the psychological twin of Ann, and yet it preserves personal identity. The engineered-in desires of Beth cause her to put in fourteen hours of work on her first day after psychosurgery; in brief, Beth A-s. Surprised in the change in her, Beth wonders what would account for her remarkable zest for philosophy. She reasons that she has grown tired with her previous ways, her life had become stale without her recognizing it, and she finally appreciates the merits of philosophy. Carefully reflecting on her values, "Beth finds that they fully support a life dedicated to philosophical work, and she wholeheartedly embraces such a life and the collection of values that supports it" (2006, 165). I share Mele's verdict that Beth is not responsible for A-ing. However, her A-ing is rationalizable: her germane behavior is directed toward achieving a goal of value to her, and apt counterfactuals in nearby worlds support this behavior.

There is a sense in which victimized Beth's reasons are not her own. Sehon acknowledges that free will "requires that the explanatory reasons for our actions be our reasons rather than reasons that are outside us and beyond our control" (174). A reasonable hypothesis is that the only plausible way to specify when one's reasons are one's own, in the relevant sense of 'one's own,' is by invoking considerations that are sensitive to how one's springs of action, such as desires and values, are acquired. But then Sehon's view that "the causal history of a behavior and its status as . . . [a free] action are fundamentally independent issues" (133) is suspect.

Finally, regarding the constraint that either we should (c) reasonably be able to judge when agents satisfy necessary conditions for free will, or else, (d) accept the view that, for practical purposes, agents don't act freely and are not responsible for their actions, one might worry about a conflation of truth and applicability. Difficulty in applying a theory to ascertain whether agents are in fact free or responsible does not entail that the theory is false. With challenging-to-apply but otherwise strong theories, one may well opt for (d).

[1] Mele, A. 2010. "Teleological Explanations of Actions: Anticausalism versus Causalism." In Causing Human Actions: New Perspectives on the Causal Theory of Action, ed. Jesus Aguilar and Andrei Buckareff, pp. 183-98 MIT Press.

[2] Mele, A. 2006. Free Will and Luck. Oxford University Press.