Free Will and Classical Theism: The Significance of Freedom in Perfect Being Theology

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Hugh J. McCann (ed.), Free Will and Classical Theism: The Significance of Freedom in Perfect Being Theology, Oxford University Press, 2017, 230pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190611200.

Reviewed by Garrett Pendergraft, Pepperdine University


This volume collects a set of papers that were presented at a conference on "Big Questions in Free Will," held at the University of Saint Thomas in October of 2014. It is dedicated to its editor, Hugh J. McCann, who passed away shortly after completing the manuscript.

I will briefly summarize each of the 11 chapters and then offer a few critical comments.

Peter van Inwagen opens the volume on a pessimistic note, claiming that "no one has any idea, any idea at all, what 'free will' means." (p. 4) Thus he restates the problem of free will as the Culpability Problem: there are seemingly unanswerable arguments for the claim that the ability to do otherwise is incompatible with determinism, but also for the claim that the ability to do otherwise is incompatible with indeterminism. So it appears that nobody has the ability to do otherwise, and moreover that nothing is ever anybody's fault. But clearly some things are sometimes somebody's fault. Van Inwagen has given up trying to solve this problem, but he does claim that almost everything written on free will over the past few decades is guilty of "verbal essentialism," and is thus irrelevant to the Culpability Problem. An argument is guilty of verbal essentialism if it depends on a term -- e.g., 'free will' -- in a way that makes it impossible to restate without using that term. He offers Daniel Dennett's recent work as a representative example.

David P. Hunt provides an illuminating framework for rethinking the problem of freedom and foreknowledge. He argues that we should approach the argument for theological fatalism as an aporetic problem: as a puzzle to be solved, rather than a reason to revise our theology, our anthropology, or even our metaphysics. Hunt supports this recommendation by appealing to historical authority, and also by showing how the aporetic approach sheds new light on the standard formulation of the argument. For example, the aporetic approach helps us see that adopting a Boethian conception of God doesn't really solve the problem, because the argument could be formulated using a hypothetical omniscient being whose beliefs do occur in time. Hunt tentatively concludes that rather than rejecting (the premise of the argument that affirms) the Principle of Alternative Possibilities (PAP) as a way to escape the argument, we should see the argument itself as a reason for doubting PAP.

McCann lays out a general account of responsibility according to which it is a custodial concept: if we are responsible for something, it is because we are answerable for it. Legal responsibility consists in being answerable to the state when we violate the imperatives that constitute the law, and the theist can view moral responsibility as analogous: when we violate moral imperatives, we are answerable to the source of those imperatives. Moreover, claims McCann, our duty to follow these imperatives is incompatible with determinism. The news is not all bad, however: since we don't have any direct duties to be virtuous, and there are other reasons to develop virtue, we can still be rational custodians of (and thus responsible for) our character even if determinism is true.

Although it might seem obvious that the metaphysical compatibilist cannot use the free will defense against the argument from evil, Michael Almeida argues that this is false. According to the free will defense, evil is a necessary consequence of free will but free will is valuable enough that a world with free will and evil is much better than a world with neither. The compatibilist might respond by saying that God could (and a morally perfect God would) create a world in which free creatures always do the right thing and evil never occurs. But the compatibilist must also say that, for any free choice to do right in such a world, there will be some other world in which the agent goes wrong with respect to that particular choice (or a closely related choice) -- i.e., in which evil occurs. So if we assume that a morally perfect God exists and that compatibilism is true, then there must be a possible world in which both God and evil exist.

Jesse Couenhoven, like Almeida, mounts an argument against an initially plausible claim -- in this case, that ought implies can (OIC). Couenhoven presents three Augustinian arguments against OIC, and then provides some textual evidence that historical Augustinians (e.g., Luther) wanted to replace OIC rather than rejecting it entirely. One promising suggestion for a replacement principle relies on Jonathan Edwards's distinction between natural and moral necessity. Roughly speaking, what makes something naturally necessary for me is external to me, whereas what makes something morally necessary for me is internal to me. Couenhoven develops this insight into ought implies apt (OIA): if I ought to perform an action A, then A is consistent with my design plan and I am functioning in the ways required for moral agency. OIA explains why we cannot be at fault for our natural inabilities, but we might be at fault for our moral inabilities. OIA also supports a hopeful outlook on the moral life, one according to which "our oughts are a gift as well as a task" (p. 90).

Katherin Rogers adopts an Anselmian account of freedom and then argues that any alleged Frankfurt-style counterexample (FSC) to PAP is an impossible situation. This is because, on Rogers's construal of Anselm, God's knowledge of a free choice depends on the actual choice and that choice is incompatible with any alternatives. Thus we cannot tell a coherent story that includes an alternative sequence in which God uses knowledge of the agent doing otherwise to prompt an intervention in which he forces the agent not to do otherwise. Rogers then argues that even the most promising variants on the standard FSCs -- blockage cases, buffer cases, and rewind cases -- fail to falsify Anselm's version of PAP (either because they don't satisfy Anselmian conditions for freedom, or because they are impossible).

Can a Calvinist be a (metaphysical) libertarian? Oliver D. Crisp argues for the affirmative, proposing a libertarian view that appears to be consistent with the documents that govern Reformed theology (e.g., the Westminster Confession). On this view, the first humans had genuine freedom to sin or to refrain from sinning; but since the fall, humans no longer have the freedom to choose to be reconciled with God (or to do anything that would make that reconciliation more likely). Original sin put union with Christ (and thus salvation) out of reach, apart from God's grace. Nevertheless, humans retain the freedom to make genuine choices, for which they are morally responsible, in numerous other contexts that don't involve eternal destiny. Crisp draws a helpful analogy between our sinful state and a state of addiction: someone might make free choices that lead to an addiction, at which point he becomes incapable of freely overcoming his addiction; he needs external help. And yet he retains the ability to make free choices in other contexts. Crisp distinguishes this "Libertarian Calvinism" from Arminianism in two ways. First, whereas both views (since they are incompatibilist views) would agree that if the choice to be reconciled with God is determined, then it is not free, the Libertarian Calvinist affirms the antecedent of that conditional while the Arminian denies the consequent. Second, the Libertarian Calvinist denies, but the Arminian affirms, that God elects on the basis of foreknowledge.

At this point the volume shifts in focus from human choice to divine choice. Signaling this shift, Kevin Timpe defends the view that God is free (in the libertarian sense of the word) against some recent objections. He endorses the normative conception of freedom that Couenhoven has developed elsewhere, but then argues that a certain type of libertarianism (what Dean Zimmerman has called "virtue libertarianism") is consistent with this normative conception of freedom. According to Timpe, an agent who is unable to do otherwise can nevertheless make a free choice -- as long as the reason why she is unable to do otherwise is a function of her freely formed moral character. Timpe then argues (in response to an objection from Wes Morriston) that God need not have moral freedom (i.e., the freedom to do wrong) since the purpose of moral freedom is to form one's moral character, and God's character is necessarily perfect. Timpe also rejects Michael Bergmann and J. A. Cover's recent attempt to construe divine agency in agent-causal terms.

Brian Leftow criticizes the rationalist view of God, according to which God must choose the option that has the most objective value (except in cases such as Buridan's Ass, in which the only available choices are arbitrary). In place of this rationalist view Leftow proposes a moderate voluntarism, according to which God can choose based on reasons (e.g., preferences) that do not perfectly track objective value. He claims several benefits for moderate voluntarism, including the following three: first, in Buridan's Ass cases, choosing on the basis of preference seems more rational than choosing arbitrarily. Second, endorsing this view gives the theist an advantage when trying to explain why we exist: it's because God preferred us (or a world containing us). Third, the voluntarist, but not the rationalist, can claim that God's motive for creating us was love for us. On Leftow's proposal, God's choices track moral value but not necessarily aesthetic value, hedonic value, or other types of nonmoral value.

W. Matthews Grant explores the doctrine of divine universal causality (DUC), which he formulates as follows: "Necessarily, for any entity distinct from God [where "entity" is broadly construed], God directly causes the whole of that entity at any time it exists" (p. 176). Grant argues that the theist who endorses DUC need not endorse occasionalism. The account he suggests is a cautious elaboration of an analogy from Aquinas, according to which secondary causes are the instruments through which God brings about certain effects. The key points of caution are that these effects are wholly brought about by God, but also wholly brought about by the secondary cause. Nevertheless, the secondary cause is not somehow more immediate or direct than the divine cause. (Another useful analogy here is that of an author: her characters and events remain immediately dependent on her even though there are also secondary causes within the story.) Grant then considers and fends off various objections to DUC before arguing that it is compatible with agent-causal views of the will.

The volume concludes with Derk Pereboom surveying the costs and benefits of affirming theological determinism. On the assumption of theological determinism, a belief in divine punishment (and in particular a belief that some receive -- and deserve -- eternal damnation) threatens to undermine the theist's relationship with God. For this reason (and other reasons, detailed elsewhere), Pereboom suggests that the theological determinist should also affirm universal salvation. The problem of evil also undermines the theist's relationship with God, because the existence of apparently gratuitous evil makes it harder to trust that God wills only the good for us. And since the free-will theodicy appears to be unavailable to the determinist, Pereboom recommends a developmental or soul-building theodicy instead. Finally, Pereboom considers the objection that a relationship with God is less valuable if the human part of that relationship is determined. He points out that there are different ways of being causally determined to love someone, and that love produced in some of those ways (e.g., parental love and romantic love) would not lose its value were it to be causally determined. Thus, we cannot conclude from the mere fact that a relationship with God is causally determined that it has less value than an indeterministic relationship.

This is not the type of volume in which the authors engage with each other, but there are several points at which it would have benefited from this type of engagement. For example, McCann's argument (p. 54) that moral responsibility is incompatible with determinism relies on ought implies can (OIC). If morality is a set of imperatives that we are obligated to obey, then, given OIC, we are able to obey these imperatives. But if determinism is true, then we are not always able to obey these imperatives: every instance in which we do wrong appears to be an instance in which we weren't able to do right. Recall, however, Couenhoven's recommendation that we replace OIC with ought implies apt (OIA): I am obligated to perform an action only if that action is compatible with my nature as a moral agent. If we effect this replacement, the conflict between determinism and McCann's custodial notion of responsibility dissolves: even when I violate the imperatives of morality, obeying those imperatives remains compatible with my moral agency. Thus we appear to have another reason to endorse OIA, namely that it shows how a robust notion of moral responsibility might be consistent with the possibility that determinism is true.

I will close with two comments on the varieties of libertarianism mentioned above. First, although I do see the appeal of the virtue libertarianism that Timpe endorses, I don't see how it can be extended to cover God's choices. Timpe notes, following Zimmerman, two distinctive features of virtue libertarianism (p. 139): first, it requires that free choices trace back to a "base case" in which the choice was the outcome of an indeterministic process; and second, it holds that the primary importance of freedom is as a necessary condition for moral goods, including character formation. Timpe then suggests (p. 140) that the virtue libertarian can describe God's volitions as free. But, as Timpe points out, God's character is necessarily perfect -- which means, contrary to the second distinctive feature of virtue libertarianism, that none of his choices contribute to character formation. It also doesn't seem accurate to describe any of God's volitions as arising out of an indeterministic process, as required by the first distinctive feature of virtue libertarianism. Thus, I would like to hear more about how the virtue libertarian can describe God's choices as free.

Second, Crisp makes a compelling case that libertarianism is consistent with Reformed theology, but I still see some friction between the two views. As Crisp notes (pp. 112-113), the Westminster Confession affirms that God ordains all things, and yet "neither is God the author of sin, nor is violence offered to the will of the creatures." It also affirms that the sinner "has wholly lost all ability . . . to convert himself, or to prepare himself thereunto." According to libertarian Calvinism, there is some choice (or set of choices) that is both essential to salvation and determined by God. In other words, one of the most significant choices the sinner can make is also one that cannot be free. Doesn't this account "offer violence to the will of creatures" in virtue of removing an important class of actions from the set of possibly free actions? Even if the libertarian conception of freedom is consistent with Calvinism, it seems that a less demanding conception of freedom (perhaps one that incorporates Edwards's distinction between natural and moral necessity) remains a better option for the proponent of Reformed theology.


Thanks to Tomás Bogardus, Taylor Cyr, and Neal Tognazzini for helpful comments on earlier drafts of this review.