Free Will and Epistemology: A Defence of the Transcendental Argument for Freedom

Placeholder book cover

Robert Lockie, Free Will and Epistemology: A Defence of the Transcendental Argument for Freedom, Bloomsbury, 2018, 303pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781350123137.

Reviewed by Stephen Kearns, Florida State University


Robert Lockie offers us a transcendental argument for free will. In particular, he argues that "we could not be epistemically justified in undermining a strong notion of free will, as a strong notion of free will would be required for any such process of undermining to be itself epistemically justified." (p. 5) The first half of the book concerns itself with arguing for a certain internalist epistemological outlook, and the second with how such an outlook provides us with an argument for free will. Lockie's strong notion of free will is libertarian -- that is, he conceives of free will as being incompatible with determinism. This conception of free will makes the book ambitious indeed -- Lockie does not simply employ the phrase "free will" to refer to the kinds of capacities he suggests underlie our epistemological activities whatever they turn out to be, but to capacities which involve the occurrence of events undetermined by their immediate event-causal antecedents (at least, I think this is what he's doing -- see below for why I'm unsure).

The first two chapters highlight certain distinctions and indicate Lockie's own way of navigating the epistemological terrain. The main distinctions covered here are those between rationality and knowledge, internalism and externalism, and the regulative and theoretical. Roughly speaking, here is the picture Lockie gives. His concern is with rationality, which he thinks requires (free) agency (while knowledge does not). He thinks it requires this (in part) because he accepts an internalist view of rationality. Lockie uses the term "internalism" to point to views that conceive of epistemic justification "as the discharge of an obligation to think well, as the fulfillment of one's intellectual duties, as responsible thought." (p. 9) Such a deontological view of one's epistemic justification is committed, in his view, to one's having robust control over one's epistemic activities. Lockie then uses the theoretical/regulatory distinction to offer an irenic solution to the warring factions of internalism and externalism. Briefly put, internalism gives us the appropriate subjective/regulatory norms for governing thought (and that constitute the norms of rationality), while externalism provides the objective/theoretical correctness conditions for knowledge.

Still, Lockie is aware that some will not be satisfied that there is any room for a notion of epistemic justification that rests so heavily on agential control. This is because, according to doxastic involuntarists, we cannot control our activity in the epistemic realm. Lockie takes up this worry in chapters 3 and 4. In chapter 3, he concedes that we do not have direct control over our beliefs but argues that this is irrelevant. We do control many executive functions in the epistemic domain. These include executive attention, goal setting, sequencing, monitoring, inhibiting, switching, planning, maintenance attention in the face of distraction, metacognition, and value-based cognition. In chapter 4, Lockie sets out an impressive array of empirical data that suggest that skeptics about epistemic agency are wrong about the extent to which we can control cognition. He allows that certain type-1 processes are not under our control, but thinks that this barely constitutes a concession to the involuntarists -- our deontic assessment of agents rests on their type-2 activity.

In chapter 5, Lockie offers a decidedly more a priori argument for his internalism. He first specifies that "we are only internalistically epistemically justified if we aim to achieve the truth (or avoid error)" but "we don't need to actually attain truth or avoid error." (pp. 111-112) His internalism, then, contrasts with others in that it does not specify an internal aim (to be reasonable, to be rational, or what have you), but an external aim (to achieve truth). What makes this an internalist picture is that justification arises from one's activities being appropriately guided by this aim, rather than in the more externalist condition of actually fulfilling it. It is this notion of justification that Lockie thinks is ineliminable. I found his reasons for thinking so somewhat obscure. He offers a transcendental argument, but it is difficult for me to say exactly what this argument is. The idea involves supposing we can "replace" (which I put in quotes because I am unsure what it means) a (partly) internalist epistemology with a purely externalist one. I think Lockie's point is that we cannot do this because even in asking the question and gathering the theoretical resources that suggest such a course of action, we are still faced with that final internalist question of whether we ought to take this course. Such a question is, for him, ineliminable.

Chapter 6 turns things more squarely towards free will. It is a defense of the view that ought implies can (OIC). In it, Lockie argues that Frankfurt-style cases -- which involve agents who make one decision but could not do otherwise because, were they about to do otherwise, some counterfactual intervener would force them to make the original choice -- do not cast doubt on OIC. His main idea is that Frankfurted agents who are blameworthy for some immoral action have the power not to be immoral. This suffices for OIC as Lockie sees it.

In Chapter 7, Lockie defends the so-called "Lazy Argument." Nowhere does Lockie give an explicit statement of this argument in premise and conclusion form, but his discussion of it begins with the closing sentence of chapter 6: "if determinism is true, all our strivings are equally futile to an absolute and categorical degree." (p. 151) This he takes to be at least an element of the Lazy Argument. Not far into the chapter, the argument seems to transform into the even more extreme claim that determinism rules out agency. (I suppose this is technically consistent with the above-quoted sentence -- all our strivings are equally futile because there are no strivings.) Given that this is right, we have an argument against determinism (and one to which the Lazy Argument is supposed draw attention): if determinism is true, there is no agency; but there is agency (see, look at me, I'm waving); so determinism is false.

Chapter 9 constitutes Lockie's reply to the luck problem (or problems) for libertarianism. Such problems have it that if an action is undetermined by its immediate causal antecedents, then it is a matter of chance, or lucky. And if it is lucky, then it is not under the control of the agent who performs the action. It is thus not free. Lockie claims that such a dilemma is false -- an action may be undetermined by "external natural law," but nevertheless be determined by the self. Thus we can tread the tightrope between necessity and chance. (I said above that I was unsure whether, for Lockie, free will involves the occurrence of events undetermined by their immediate event-causal antecedents. This is because I am unsure what self-determination amounts to. Lockie denies it is agent-causation.)

In chapters 8 and 10, Lockie presents various transcendental arguments for libertarianism. I state them in their barest bones:

The conative transcendental argument (p. 178): All executive human activity is an attempt to avoid or alter something. If determinism is true, we are powerless to avoid or alter p, for any arbitrary p. It is futile to attempt to alter or avoid something (we know) we are powerless to alter or avoid. Thus if determinism is true, it is futile to (amongst other things) strive to understand it, or even entertain the possibility that it is true (for such things are attempts to alter something).

The ethical transcendent argument (pp. 179-180): Ought implies can. If determinism is true, we are powerless to perform any action we don't perform (or to refrain from any action we do perform). If there's nothing we ought to do that we don't do (and, indeed, there cannot be such), there's nothing we ought to do. Thus, if determinism is true, there is no oughts-based morality.

The indirect (standard) epistemic transcendental argument (pp. 182-183): Ought implies can. If determinism is true, we are powerless to reason differently than we do. If it's always false that we ought to reason differently than we do (and, indeed, things cannot be otherwise than this), then there's no way we ought to reason. So if determinism is true, it is false that we ought to believe it (and false that we ought not to believe, for example, libertarianism).

The direct (source) epistemic transcendental argument (pp. 230-231): To be justified in believing determinism, a determinist's embrace of determinism must be partly determined by epistemic justifiers. If determinism is true, determinists adopt the position (entirely) because of the Big Bang and the laws of nature, which were fixed billions of years ago. But billions of years ago, there were no epistemic justifiers. So, no determinist is justified in believing determinism.

And with that, determinism is defeated and libertarianism reigns.

Not really.

I next turn to a number of worries about Lockie's arguments, concentrating on those topics more related to free will. Consider first his (near?) endorsement of the view that determinism is incompatible with agency. As he mentions, such a view is maintained by Helen Steward. As it happens, I have had occasion to mention Steward's agency-incompatibilism in NDPR before. My complaint there was:

It seems quite possible for a near-as-dammit intrinsic duplicate of an agent to exist in a deterministic universe. Given that this is possible, there seems every reason to attribute agency to such an object. What is gained by treating something like this as lacking beliefs, desires, or intentions? It surely behooves us to take the intentional stance to such a being. If this is right, however, then determinism is compatible with agency. Steward must not only deny that determinism is compatible with agency, but also that it is compatible with anything that behaves like an agent. What is it about determinism that rules out such behaviour?

We might put the same question to Lockie: what is it about determinism that rules out there being things that behave like us? If nothing rules it out, Lockie is forced to say that such things do not act intentionally, voluntarily, think, etc. This is not only metaphysically implausible, but also ethically problematic (suppose we discover such deterministic creatures -- is it okay to do to them as we please, because they cannot really be thinkers or agents?).

Next consider Lockie's reply to the luck problem -- we determine our free actions, not "external natural laws." I don't really understand Lockie's position, partly because he denies he is invoking agent causation and partly because I don't know what he means by "determine." On my understanding of "determine", if something determines an agent's choice, then, assuming incompatibilism (which I don't but Lockie does), the agent could not have done otherwise at the time of choice. This is so for the exact same reasons that an event's determining the choice rules out the existence of alternatives. If the agent genuinely determines the choice at a certain time, then there is no possible world in which the agent exists at that time, the laws of nature are the same, the background conditions (including the state of the agent at that time, but excluding the fact that the agent makes the choice) are the same, but at which the agent fails to make that choice. This is simply part of what it is for one thing to (causally) determine another. If an agent can cause a choice but can also, in a possible world with the exact same laws and background conditions, fail to cause this choice, then the agent does not determine this choice.

Turn lastly to Lockie's transcendental arguments for free will and against determinism. There is much to comment on here, but I will limit myself to three points. Firstly, none of the arguments explicitly conclude that determinism is false or that libertarianism is true. At most they conclude that if determinism is true, then we are not justified in believing it, or there is nothing we ought to do, etc. Such conclusions are all perfectly compatible with determinism's in fact being true. They do not, then, constitute arguments against it, or for libertarianism.

Secondly, at least sometimes, the conclusions don't follow from the premises, at least if we are charitable in our understanding of the premises. Take, for instance, the direct (source) epistemic transcendental argument. This tells us that, if determinism is true, our beliefs are entirely determined by events that happened at a time when there were no epistemic justifiers. This is true if we understand "entirely determine" to mean that such events causally suffice for our beliefs. It is false if we understand it to mean that no other events determine our beliefs -- there are many events that do so, even if these events are in their turn determined by other events. Charitably reading "entirely determine" in the first sense (to make the claim come out true) renders the argument invalid -- though some events that causally suffice for our beliefs occurred at a time before there were epistemic justifiers, other (later) events may also causally suffice for our beliefs while being epistemic justifiers for those beliefs. Another example: part of Lockie's conative transcendental argument has it that, if determinism is true, we are powerless to avoid or alter p, for any arbitrary p. For this to be right, we must understand "p" to range over something like timelessly true propositions. Still, if we read Lockie as meaning this by "p," his conclusion (that it is futile to strive even to understand determinism if determinism obtains) no longer follows. This is because the truth of determinism does nothing to preclude our changing objects, preventing events from happening, bringing things about, ensuring that propositions are false that would otherwise have been true, etc.

Thirdly, many of the arguments rely on the soundness of the Consequence Argument (see, e.g., van Inwagen), and in particular on (a) the claim that we have no power over the past or the laws, and (b) the validity of the inference from an agent's having no power over the past or laws to her having no power over whatever the past and laws necessitate. Issues surrounding the Consequence Argument are subtle and difficult, and it is not clear who has the upper hand in this debate. I can say, however, that Lockie provides us with one of the least charitable discussions of the compatibilist position I have encountered. In effect, he claims (without citing any compatibilists) that compatibilists insist we must equivocate to avoid the incompatibilist conclusion: yes, they supposedly say, we are powerless to alter or avoid the past (and the laws), but in some other sense, we can avoid or alter what they necessitate.

To this, Lockie points out that equivocation is a fallacy. Well, yes it is, but it's deeply unclear why he thinks the compatibilist commits it. Some compatibilists, it is true, think that there is an ambiguity in phrases like "has no power over x" between, roughly, "has no power to change or affect x" and "has no power to do something such that, were one to do it, x would be different" (see, for example, Lewis); but such compatibilists typically think that, on the first understanding, (b) fails (we cannot infer from our powerlessness over the past and laws to our powerless over our actions) and, on the second, (a) fails (we do have such counterfactual power over the past or laws). They do not insist on equivocating, but rather on doing precisely the opposite -- we must carefully disambiguate versions of the Consequence Argument and address each of them.

In my estimation, then, Lockie fails in his ambitions to produce a transcendental argument for the truth of libertarianism (the thesis that there is free will, and such is incompatible with determinism). Such a failure was probably inevitable.


Frankfurt, H. (1969) "Alternate Possibilities and Moral Responsibility", Journal of Philosophy 66: 829-839.

Kearns, S. (2012) "Review of Free Will and Modern Science", 2012.08.41, Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews.

Steward, H. (2012) The Metaphysics of Freedom, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Lewis, D. (1981) "Are We Free to Break the Laws?", Theoria 47: 113-21.

Van Inwagen, P. (1983) An Essay on Free Will, Oxford: Clarendon Press.