Free Will and Luck

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Alfred R. Mele, Free Will and Luck, Oxford University Press, 2006, 223pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 0195305043.

Reviewed by Saul Smilansky, University of Haifa


Alfred Mele has been making innovative suggestions and significant contributions to debates on action theory, autonomy, free will, rationality, and Akrasia for some 20 years, in books coming out with admirable regularity. This book joins the others, and focuses particularly on exploring the role luck may play in free will, and what this might imply.

The first chapter sets the stage, making conceptual stipulations and going over the outline of some of Mele's previous work. Chapter 2 is an examination and a critique of Benjamin Libet's famous experimental work on consciousness and control. Chapter 3 examines various recent libertarian attempts to deal with luck. Chapter 4 considers Frankfurt-type examples, while chapter 5 returns to propose a somewhat more ambitious libertarian proposal than Mele previously suggested. Chapters 6 and 7 deal with compatibilism: with Mele's critique of other peoples' views on compatibilism, and with Mele's replies to critiques of his own work, respectively. Mele concludes the book, as he did his previous work, by leaving us with various possibilities on the free will problem.

The book is well-written and meticulously argued, and positions are carefully defined and presented. Mele's writing is a model of analytical exposition, although its technicality will quickly scare off the uninitiated. And as always, Mele is the master of the philosophical thought experiment, and manages to make convincing positions where others have feared to tread (or indeed would have never thought it were possible to tread). My favorite was the agent who votes freely for Al Gore while not being intentionally-able to vote for him (p.25). This book is too rich, sophisticated, and diffused, for me to be able to examine most of it. I will only take up a few points.

Chapter 2, on the Libet experiments, is only tangentially related to the topics of the book, yet we should be grateful to Mele for including it. Libet claims to have shown through experimental work that, roughly, decisions or pre-decisions take place in people's brains, before those people report any awareness of them. This raises the radical prospect that, instead of conscious control and free human deciding, what really goes on is unconscious and unfree; with consciousness and the sense of choosing and deciding being merely epiphenomena. Mele convincingly shows, in my opinion, that Libet has not done what he thinks he has done, and has in no way refuted the commonsense view about the viability of conscious human control, nor proved anything either way on free will. In a tour de force of careful philosophical analysis, Mele reinterprets Libet's own data in a very different way:

Nothing justifies the claim that what a subject becomes aware of at time W is a decision to flex that has already been made or an intention to flex that has already been acquired, as opposed, for example, to an urge to flex that has already arisen. (p.40)

Philosophers may share the evident pleasure Mele gets from thrashing Libet, when they read Libet's vain and distasteful reaction to the previous skepticism of some philosophers, at the end of the chapter.

Another part of the book which I found powerful and convincing is chapter 3, which considers how well some prominent libertarian models deal with the role of luck. Mele discusses Robert Kane's event-casual account, and Timothy O'Connor and Randolph Clarke's agent-casual ones (Clarke has recently moved away from agent-causality). Mele traces the threat luck poses to these different models, and shows that these libertarian attempts fail to calm the worry. Consider an instance of free action, across otherwise identical worlds: according to libertarian models, we would get different results (according to determinism we of course would not). But then, Mele points out, there is the question whether the difference in how an agent acts in one world and the way she acts in an otherwise identical world is just a matter of luck; and if that is so -- why the agent is thought to be in control, in a robust sense, and morally responsible.

Turning to some criticism, I think, first, that the book tries to do too much. By seemingly trying to reply to every bit of criticism, and criticize so much of the work of others, the book remains too diffused. Too much of it depends on familiarity with Mele's previous work, or with the other debates which bear on Mele's work. And much of it, for all its force, is grounded too much in the sort of debates that rage regularly in philosophical journals, with their tentative gives and takes. Mele is always interesting and frequently fun to read, on both offence and defense, but I doubt if all of this material should have gone into book form.

One major doubt confronts Mele's libertarianism. I have never been much attracted by the sort of modest libertarianism which is happy merely that indeterminism may mix things up a bit, because its supporters "value being the kind of agent of whom it is false that his every thought and action is part of a deterministic causal chain stretching back to the vicinity of the big bang" (p.99). But clearly some people do find this intervening randomness psychologically helpful (one is reminded of William James's horror of a deterministic "block universe"). And libertarians have shown that their models can do more or less equally well, in giving agents control and moral responsibility, as do the compatibilist models. However, the big question is whether all such modest libertarian models (e.g. Robert Kane's. Mele's) go much beyond compatibilism. Traditionally, libertarian models were certainly supposed to do so. Libertarianism as the unique human ability to transcend the normal course of events (whether strictly determined or peppered by indeterminism), a superior sort of control going far beyond what compatibilism at its best can offer, is where the philosophical money lies. Perhaps agent-causality would be needed for that sort of "super-control". In any case, Mele seems to be skeptical about such libertarian transcendence (I myself share Galen Strawson's view that it is even incoherent), but he somehow doesn't take the importance of this skepticism seriously enough. Libertarianism is an attempt to meet the demandingness of incompatibilism by posing something that is of a very different order than compatibilism. Compatibilists propose that we limit our expectations, but libertarians are supposed to meet our highest expectations. Setting out various novel versions of modest libertarianism will remain of limited philosophical interest, as long as the great majority of incompatibilists (both optimistic libertarians and pessimistic non-libertarians) see non-modest forms of libertarian free will as what it's all about.

Another major issue is raised by Mele's compatibilism. Some skeptics about compatibilism (including myself) will not deny that compatibilism makes partial sense, but accept the compatibilist distinctions, and even acknowledge that compatibilist notions of ability or responsibility, say, are important. Mele himself considers such positions (primarily of the libertarian sort; he calls these "soft libertarianism"). What such opponents of compatibilism will say, however, is that even once we grant all of this to the compatibilist, compatibilism remains shallow, in moral and personal terms. On the ultimate level, the fact that all is luck, that all our doings are in a final reckoning not up to us, is the real worry for compatibilists. Is it just that a man will serve 20 years in prison, if we do not believe that the motivation set which led to his committing the crime was ultimately up to him, but was merely something he found himself with? (Saying that he could modify it is no help, since the existence of an inclination to change or not to change was similarly a matter of luck.) Similarly, is our view of ourselves or of our loved ones not transformed, once we see that any sacrifice or achievement is ultimately merely the unfolding of the given? Mele does not take such deeper doubts about compatibilism seriously enough. Otherwise a pessimistic incompatibilism (typically thought of as hard determinism, although determinism is not the issue here) would have had much more of a presence in the book.

The challenge to compatibilism can come at two levels. First, we can doubt whether it is possible to make any sense of free will and moral responsibility in a world without "transcendent" (non-modest) libertarian free will. Second, granting that to some extent we can do so, we can then begin to have deeper worries, as to whether compatibilism suffices. To say that it does not is to say that, although we acknowledge the viability of compatibilist control and responsibility, the fact that we cannot have the immodest types of libertarian free will nevertheless matters greatly. If we have this distinction in focus, we see that Mele does not much address the second challenge.

This criticism matters here because the deeper worries, and the pessimistic replies to them, seem to be a very real possibility, given Mele's own positions. As we saw, he does not think that libertarians have made significant progress in quieting the luck-related worries. And he is not one of those bite-the-bullet compatibilists, who do not care about ultimate luck. Hence, he should be much more concerned about hard determinism (or some similar pessimistic incompatibilism). In other words, the temperament of Mele's work, here as previously, is open, but optimistic: compatibilism is probably successful, and so is libertarianism; since either is sufficient, all is well. But I doubt whether all this optimism is justified by Mele's own arguments. Even if we have a measure of free will and moral responsibility, all is not well, if we care about luck, due to the limits it imposes upon control, and the ensuing moral arbitrariness.

In pointing out the possibility of such criticism I also express my personal hope that Mele will move on beyond the contributions that he has already made. Like Mele's previous work, this is an unusually creative and fruitful book. But just because Mele has achieved such exemplary clarity, ingenuity, and critical force in elucidating both libertarianism and compatibilism, one can hope that he will engage more with the darker potential of the free will problem.