Free Will and Modern Science

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Richard Swinburne (ed.), Free Will and Modern Science, Oxford University Press, 2011, 206pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780197264898.

Reviewed by Stephen Kearns, Florida State University


Free Will and Modern Science, edited by Richard Swinburne, is a collection of eleven papers (plus a foreword by Peter Simons and an introduction by Swinburne) that I initially assumed would concern free will, modern science, and their interplay. Indeed, some of the papers concern both topics and most of them concern at least one, but in general there was less material than one might expect, given the title and foreword, on how research in free will can be informed by modern science (and vice versa). Some papers make little or no reference to modern science, beyond generalities (including those by R.A. Duff, Frank Jackson, Galen Strawson, Helen Steward, and Howard Robinson), and some make little mention of free will or moral responsibility (including those by Howard Robinson, Solomon Feferman, and J.R. Lucas).

The first two papers in the collection, by Patrick Haggard and Tim Bayne respectively, do concern modern science's relevance to free will, as does the paper by Harald Atmanspacher and Stefan Rotter, and Richard Swinburne's. Due to limitations of space, I cannot discuss all of the papers. In what follows, there is an extended discussion of Haggard's paper, somewhat briefer discussions of Bayne's, Strawson's, Steward's, and Robinson's papers, and very brief glosses of the rest.

Haggard's "Does brain science change our view of free will?" nicely sets out some data from neuroscience, which Haggard then relates to free will. Haggard has little truck with philosophical debates on this topic. His preferred method of research is to set out clearly testable criteria for free will and then (you guessed it) test them. There are two criteria for free will as Haggard understands the term: the "could have done otherwise" condition and the subjective experience condition. Haggard is quick to point out that the first is to be understood in a particular way:

Movement neuroscience understands 'could have done otherwise' in terms of a process of action selection that arbitrates between competing action alternatives, and selects the one that eventually occurs . . . The neuroscientific interpretation emphasizes only that alternative possibilities are represented in the mind/brain, and does not comment on whether those possibilities could have actually happened. (9)

The subjective experience criterion is, roughly, our being conscious of willing the action. Haggard defends the idea that conscious volition is central to free will against the claim that conscious volitions are merely "retrospective confabulations". That is, such experience is not simply a story we tell ourselves after the action is completed. To this end, Haggard highlights experiments that confirm that our feeling of control is due to those brain processes that lead to action.

Haggard's discussion of the former criterion centres around those areas of the brain that feed signals to the primary motor cortex (which in turn sends signals to the muscles). These are the presupplementary motor area (preSMA) and the supplementary motor area (SMA). Haggard presents experimental evidence that the preSMA prevents us from acting on every impulse, while both it and the SMA help us select from the available competing alternatives.

Haggard's grasp of the relevant neuroscience is, to my untrained eye, excellent. His impatience with philosophy, however, can sometimes lead him to make questionable claims. I shall here highlight four. Consider the following claim, which Haggard thinks of as "unremarkable" from "a neuroscientific standpoint":

Although consciousness may be part of brain activity, consciousness cannot cause brain activity, nor can it cause actions. (18)

From a philosophical standpoint (at least, from mine), this does seem rather remarkable. This is not simply because any epiphenomenalist conclusion is implausible, but because Haggard readily accepts that brain activity causes other brain activity and actions. He thus seems to be committed to the following: consciousness is part of brain activity; brain activity causes other brain activity and actions; but consciousness cannot cause brain activity or actions. While not strictly inconsistent, the combination of such views is decidedly peculiar. He appears to posit a certain type of brain activity (consciousness) that has no causal effect on our actions or on other brain activity. One wonders what scientific evidence there is (or could be) for such a hypothesis.

Haggard also makes a very strong claim concerning the methodology of neuroscience:

Neuroscience is fundamentally deterministic, in its methods, its assumptions and its outlooks. (8)

This claim is not itself a neuroscientific one, but one that concerns neuroscience. It also seems very unlikely. No science should base its methods and assumptions on something as scientifically controversial as determinism. Indeterminism is, at the very least, an open epistemic possibility, and is often considered likely to be true. Furthermore, it is hard to see exactly why one needs to assume determinism in order to conceive of and carry out the experiments Haggard details in his paper. In all this, I concur with Atmanspacher and Rotter, who conclude their very interesting paper, "On determinacy or its absence in the brain", as follows:

well-founded arguments to defend the position that neurobiology 'is' deterministic, or that it 'is' not, are hardly available. Our bottom line is that pretentious claims as to deterministic or indeterministic brain activity are unfounded, and so are the consequences drawn from them. (99)

(This is all I shall mention of this paper, but it certainly worth examining the evidence they adduce.)

Third, Haggard seems to be under the impression that agent causation is the most popular contender for the correct view of free will in philosophical circles (something which brain science is supposed to cure us of). Thus he writes:

Conventional metaphysics of free will invokes an 'I' to consciously initiate willed actions. (23)

In fact, most philosophers oppose agent causation. Most are compatibilists (who, almost without exception, reject agent causation), while many incompatibilists also reject agent causation, (in favour of event-causal, or non-causal views).

Finally, Haggard ends with certain claims about what brain science shows about free will. One is this:

[Brain science] will show that the 'could have done otherwise' criterion of free will refers to the engagement of a neural memory buffer that stores possible alternative actions. (23)

Here my worry is that what Haggard claims brain science will show is very close to how Haggard initially describes the relevant criterion. Compare the quotation directly above with that from page nine. While the former is more specific, and thus can count as a scientific discovery, it cannot simply be taken for granted that it is what the ability to do otherwise amounts to, as so much of its content is already built into the stipulated criterion. Philosophical work still needs to be done to discover if this criterion is the one relevant to attributions of freedom and responsibility.

Tim Bayne's "Libet and the case for free will skepticism" addresses those free will sceptics who argue from Libet's experimental results to the conclusion that humans lack free will. Libet found (if his interpretation of the data is accurate) that before the onset of a conscious intention to a (certain type of) action, an agent's readiness potential (RP) ramps up. From this, some have concluded that RPs, rather than conscious intentions, initiate actions. They conclude that these actions, and indeed actions in general, are not free.

Bayne thinks the sceptics' argument revolves around three claims. First, the actions observed in Libet's studies are not the result of conscious decisions, but of the RP. Second, free actions are the result of conscious decisions. Third, if the actions studied by Libet are not free, then no actions are. Though he finds some fault with all of these premises, Bayne's main complaint is with the first. The only RPs measured in Libet-style experiments are those that are followed by muscle activity (i.e. onset of action). There is no way of telling how often RPs occur which do not lead to such action. Furthermore, Bayne plausibly maintains that RPs should be considered initiators of action only if there is a high probability that the latter occurs after the former. Given that we do not know if this is the case (as Libet-style experiments only measure those RPs that are followed by actions), we have been given no evidence that RPs initiate the actions that follow them. The first premise (that the actions studied by Libet are the result of the RP, not conscious decision) is thus left completely unsupported.

While I am sympathetic with almost everything Bayne says on this topic, his above reply to the sceptic suggests that if we were to discover that some neural event precedes and initiates all of our actions, this would threaten our free will. Indeed, he makes this point explicit in his conclusion. I am much more doubtful of this. Being a rather boring compatibilist, I can happily accept such a possibility (and I think others should do the same). If this supposed threat doesn't (perhaps implicitly) rely on incompatibilist intuitions, I'd like to hear why not.

Galen Strawson's "The impossibility of ultimate responsibility" is basically the same paper as his "The impossibility of moral responsibility" (Philosophical Studies, 1994, 75:5-24), though possibly with a tempered conclusion. Strawson argues that we are not responsible for our actions because we are not causa sui (causes of ourselves). Strawson mentions the obvious compatibilist rejoinder that we do not need to be causa sui to be responsible for our actions. Oddly, mention it is all he does. He neither presents the arguments for this view, nor attempts to rebut this response. Despite this, he claims both that our being causa sui is the (or at least a) common view, and that many people take it to be a necessary condition of moral responsibility. Both these claims seem empirically testable. Even if they both turn out to be true, this is little indication we are causa sui, or that being so is necessary for responsibility. Strawson concurs with the former point. One wonders why he is so reticent to accept that we need not be causa sui to be morally responsible, even if this jars with our pretheoretical view. (Perhaps he is less reticent that he sometimes seems. In his previous paper he argues for the impossibility of moral responsibility. In this he argues for the impossibility only of ultimate responsibility. Further, he also claims that much of our thinking on free will is indeed compatibilist. He thinks this may speak to an inconsistency in our conception of free will and responsibility. My question is: if this is right, isn't it clear what to jettison? Hint: there's something to be said for not demanding the clearly impossible of free will.)

Helen Steward argues in "Moral responsibility and the concept of agency" that agency itself (and not simply free will or moral responsibility) is incompatible with determinism. The reason, roughly speaking, is that if one is an agent then (some of) what one does is up to one. Steward conceives of something's being up to one as one's being able to settle certain things that are not already settled. If determinism is true, then everything anyone does is already settled by the initial conditions of the universe and the laws of nature. Thus determinism rules out agency. (Steward then utilizes this result to argue that Frankfurt-style cases fail to show that we do not need to be able to do otherwise to be morally responsible.)

Steward is aware of the natural objection to her view: we do not know whether determinism is true or not, thus if Steward is right that it rules out agency, we do not know whether any agents exist. This is absurd, however, as it is obvious that agents exist. Steward reverses the argument and claims that we do know that determinism is false. This is bound to raise a few eyebrows and possibly some tempers.

Another reply is available to Steward, though at perhaps too high a cost. We may conclude that we do not know whether any agents exist only if we know that determinism rules out agency (rather than its simply being true that is does). Steward defends only that determinism is incompatible with agency, not that we know it is so. If she denies that we know it, she can maintain that agents are known to exist, and that determinism is an open epistemic possibility. Still, this is may be an uncomfortable view to maintain, coming perilously close as it does to a form of Moore's paradox (determinism does preclude agency, but I don't know it does).

The worry I have with Steward's agency-incompatibilism is slightly different. It seems quite possible for a near-as-dammit intrinsic duplicate of an agent to exist in a deterministic universe. Given that this is possible, there seems every reason to attribute agency to such an object. What is gained by treating something like this as lacking beliefs, desires, or intentions? It surely behooves us to take the intentional stance to such a being. If this is right, however, then determinism is compatible with agency. Steward must not only deny that determinism is compatible with agency, but also that it is compatible with anything that behaves like an agent. What is it about determinism that rules out such behaviour?

Howard Robinson's "Substance dualism and its rationale" puts forward an argument for substance dualism. Here's how (as far as I can tell) the argument runs. The identity across worlds of physical objects (e.g. our bodies) is a matter of convention or choice. In some cases, whether a certain object would or would not be my body has no objective, choice-independent answer. In contrast, the transworld identity of conscious subjects (e.g. us) is not a matter of convention or choice. Thus conscious subjects are not physical objects. Since we are substances of some kind, but not of a physical kind, substance dualism follows.

Robinson rests a lot on this supposed difference between physical objects and us. I'm somewhat doubtful of this difference. If one is a counterpart theorist (and thus denies any genuine transworld identity), one will be so for both physical objects and conscious subjects alike. If one thinks modality is a matter of convention, one will not make an exception for conscious subjects. If one is a fan of good old fashioned transworld identity, one will apply it to all (genuine) objects.

Robinson may object that everyone of the latter persuasion should think at least some types of objects enjoy merely conventional transworld identity -- nations, games of chess, etc. -- while other things -- like us -- do not. But even if this is right (and I doubt it), the only objects with such conventional identity conditions will not be genuine. They will not "cut nature at the joints". Unless Robinson is willing to maintain that no physical objects cut at the joints, many will have non-conventional transworld identities. Our bodies are good candidates.

To give a sense of what the papers I have not discussed involve, I offer the following one-sentence glosses of them. (It need not be said--or perhaps it does, since I feel the need to say it--that such glosses do not do the papers justice and their being merely glossed is no reflection of their quality.) Duff argues convincingly that in order to be fairly held criminally responsible, one need not be ultimately responsible for one's actions (in roughly the sense Strawson mentions in his paper). Feferman argues that, contra Lucas and others, Gödel's incompleteness theorems and our grasp of them do not entail that we are not machines, to which Lucas offers a brief rebuttal. Jackson offers a clear statement of, and some arguments for, his preferred type of physicalism and discusses what impact the truth of physicalism has on the existence of free will (spoiler alert: not much). Swinburne argues, in a paper filled with sometimes meandering but always intriguing discussion, that neuroscience will never be able to reliably predict human action, which leaves the door open for a dualist, libertarian, agent-causalist metaphysics (which Swinburne thinks is true to the phenomenology of freedom). As should be clear, the topics of the papers in this book span a rather wide spectrum. This is no bad thing, but may come as a bit of a surprise.