Free Will and the Rebel Angels in Medieval Philosophy

Free Will And The Rebel Angels

Tobias Hoffmann, Free Will and the Rebel Angels in Medieval Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2020, 292pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107155381.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Hause, Creighton University


Tobias Hoffmann's book focuses on Latin-language accounts of free will in the work of 13th and 14th century Christian philosophers. These philosophers draw on a complex network of traditions. The influence of Augustine is pervasive, and key ideas from Anselm, Bernard of Clairvaux, and Peter Lombard likewise shape these scholastic discussions. As the 13th century progresses, the conceptual frameworks of ancient Greek-speaking thinkers -- in particular Aristotle, but also Nemesius and Pseudo-Dionysius -- gain dominance. Of course, the Bible, interpreted in a spectacularly varied number of ways, also serves as an authoritative source. Despite the sometimes jumbled intricacies besetting this topic, Hoffmann provides a readable, lucid, and even absorbing treatment. His book tells a story of a family of ideas as they are generated, developed, criticized, rehabilitated, re-envisioned, killed off, and resurrected (so that this study has all the twists and turns of a Thackery novel). By the final chapter, we are reminded both of the striking ingenuity of scholastic philosophy as well as its limitations.

Hoffmann's survey begins by summarizing the purposes and arguments of three figures whose approach to freedom of will differs strikingly from that of their late medieval successors: Anselm, Bernard of Clairvaux, and Lombard. These earlier figures discuss what they call liberum arbitrium, or "free decision," in the context of sin, and this context prompts many of the central questions they ask (such as whether free decision includes the freedom to sin). Knowing almost nothing of Aristotle's ethics or moral psychology, they draw their inspiration instead from scripture and whatever access they had to patristic sources. The rediscovery of Aristotle's ethical and psychological works led their 13th-century successors to re-envision these earlier approaches to free decision. Aristotle furnished scholastic philosophers with accounts of deliberation and choice, with a schema by which to explain the various causal influences of objects on the soul's capacities and of those capacities on each other, with explanations of the role that cognitive and appetitive failures, and those failures' interconnections, played in sin. So, beginning with Philip the Chancellor, we see the rise of a new perspective on free decision and its significance. Philip situates his own account not in the context of sin, but in the context of psychology. This is the start of what Hoffmann calls "the psychological turn."

Human psychology is a messy, complicated system of interconnected rational and sensory cognitive and appetitive capacities. To understand scholastic ethics, we have to understand this daunting system. However, to understand free decision or, as it will eventually be more commonly termed, free will, we do not. Scholastic philosophers generally agree that the capacities responsible for agency, control, and free decision are the two that embodied humans have in common with the bodiless angels: intellect and will. Hoffmann therefore supplements accounts of human freedom by drawing freely on discussions of angelic freedom. Not only are the latter accounts more streamlined (shorn as they are of the messiness of human passion and dull-mindedness), but the questions they address -- in particular, the question of how an agent without prior moral defects can produce an evil choice -- require philosophers to offer focused explanations of where, in the interaction between intellect, will, and their objects, an agent's freedom is located.

Hoffmann dedicates most of his efforts to explaining the ways in which scholastic thinkers address persistent questions about free will in responding to each other's treatments. Despite the many recent protests against the practice, Hoffmann divides his target philosophers into intellectualists, voluntarists, and various permutations of the two. Intellectualists "define free agency mainly with reference to the intellect," and voluntarists define it "mainly with reference to the will" (5). By his clear success in showing the lines of influence and inheritance among members of each group, Hoffmann demonstrates the clear usefulness of these categories, provided that they are treated with the subtlety and nuance he affords them: We see the ways in which intellectualists and voluntarists argued against each other, the ways in which successive generations of each group bolstered their predecessors' arguments, the ways in which they sometimes made concessions to the opposing camp to create muted or hybrid views (that generally pleased no one). Throughout the era under discussion, the general problems for each group remain the same: Voluntarists find it difficult to explain such metaphysically mysterious apparatus as a self-moving will, while intellectualists find it difficult to explain how natural causes do not necessitate the intellect and, as a result, the will.

The book excels in many categories, most obviously in its patient, lucid, methodical presentation of often frustratingly complex ideas. I would like to focus on a feature of the work that readers may overlook: It tells a story about the development of ideas about free will, control, and autonomy that serves as a model for outstanding philosophical pedagogy for anyone who needs to teach or write on "multigenerational" history of philosophy. For most of the book, Hoffmann "vanishes," bringing each medieval philosopher to center stage. The book thereby avoids devolving into mere summary or into anachronistic discussions that showcase contemporary concerns over and above those of the philosophers under discussion. This style of presentation likewise allows the reader to understand how medieval thinkers learned from each other (as, for instance, Duns Scotus combines Peter John Olivi's account of synchronic contingency with a re-purposed Anselmian "two-wills" view to develop one of the most influential and controversial accounts of free will in scholastic philosophy). We see in these examples how, over the course of two hundred years, philosophers come to a better -- or at any rate, further -- understanding of these problems. We also see how a philosopher's focus on one particular field of philosophy over others (such as metaphysics over psychology) influences the development of that philosopher's ideas. By the end of the book, we have a multi-generational view of the often ingenious strategies medieval thinkers employ to argue against, bolster, or re-envision the views of their predecessors.

Hoffmann structures his study to let each target philosopher's views shine through without much authorial intrusion. He succeeds in this task by creating a minimalist framework on which he mounts key problems to be discussed such as the way philosophers explain how the agent is an act's source and how that act is contingent. He then lets the medieval thinkers themselves discuss these problems. One ingenious method for achieving this goal is the book's thematic structure. Hoffmann does not begin at the beginning, so to speak, and trudge through everything he wants to say about Anselm, then Bernard, then Bonaventure, and so on until the inevitable book-ending Ockham unit. Each chapter discusses a limited range of issues and treats them from a particular perspective (e.g., hybrid intellectualist-voluntarist theories or the will as the source of moral evil). The limited scope of each chapter means that the author does not have to make a lot of transitions among a single philosopher's ideas. The reader can easily keep the goals of each chapter in mind without a lot of intrusive guidance from the author. However, Hoffmann then layers the discussions of each chapter one over the other as we look at the same or similar problems from different perspectives. Each successive chapter, therefore, brings something new to what is already familiar.

Specialists in medieval moral psychology may disagree with the details of some of Hoffmann's interpretations, but even the more controversial ones are clear, well defended, and plausible. More than once Hoffmann rectifies commonly held misinterpretations. Only two of Hoffmann's interpretations strike me as problematic, and neither of them affects the book's argument. The first is his assertion that, in Anselm's view, while "it is possible to act on the will for happiness and contrary to the will for justice, he does not deem it possible to bypass the will for happiness" (17). Because it is not clear what "bypass" means, this claim is likely to mislead readers into thinking that it is impossible for an agent to will justice at the expense of advantage. However, in On the Fall of the Devil, Anselm describes the choice of the angels who persevered as one in which they preferred justice to a conflicting advantage. Hoffmann rightly points out that, in Anselm's view, willing justice is a necessary condition for securing happiness, but it does not follow from this that by willing justice one also wills happiness.

The second and more problematic claim comes at the end of Chapter 7, "The Will as the Cause of Evil." In the prior chapter ("Does Evil Have a Cause?"), Hoffmann provides an exposition of Augustine's views on the origin of moral evil, that is, of the first evil will. Augustine argues that a good will cannot be the cause of an evil will; and while a bad will can, it cannot be the cause of the first evil will. Building on prior work by T.D.J. Chappell and Peter King, Hoffmann explains that the first cause of evil (of Lucifer's sin), which Augustine describes as a "deficient cause" (City of God 12.7), is neither a "deficient efficient cause" nor a "privation of efficient causation" (168). We can say little more than that the first cause of evil is a deficient cause, leaving the explanation of its deficiency mysterious.

Hoffmann then appeals to this exposition of Augustine to begin his next chapter with an irony: Many medieval thinkers (such as Lombard, William of Auxerre, and Richard of Menneville) believe that they are following Augustine's lead in explaining the origin of the first evil but instead hold the contradictory view that the power of the will, which is a good, is in fact a cause of moral evil. After surveying the disparate views of such thinkers as Bonaventure, Aquinas, Scotus, and Pouilly, Hoffmann ends the chapter with a second Augustinian irony: As different as these theories are, "they converge where we might least expect it: on Augustine's idea that the cause of evil is deficient, that is, that there is no ultimate explanation for why someone does evil" (195). However, Hoffmann has not provided sufficient evidence to bear out this extraordinary conclusion. For instance, Pouilly, making explicit a line of thought suggested by Aquinas, notes that the explanation of the deficient will is negligence. Hoffmann, correctly noting that this negligence has no per se cause, leaps to the conclusion that in Pouilly's view this negligence is "at bottom unexplainable" (195). Rather, Pouilly seems to have thought he had explained it very well by appealing to non-fortuitous per accidens causation. What Hoffmann has done is simply to raise questions about how, in Pouilly's account, an agent can exercise control over diligence and negligence by such per accidens causation. In no way can he conclude that Pouilly sees himself as converging with Augustine; nor does anything he writes here justify the weaker assertion that Pouilly is committed to the Augustinian view. Hoffmann needs to provide further evidence for such a claim, based in part on deeper investigation into both Pouilly's account of control and his understanding of the natural movements and dispositions of practical reason.

There is no single correct way of doing history of philosophy, though practitioners of the many apt ways often carry them out badly. Hoffmann has chosen to let his target philosophers showcase themselves by minimizing his authorial voice and allowing the genuine drama of ideas unfold before us as we read. Because he is extraordinarily adept at this method, the book will be a useful model to anyone working in the history of philosophy of any region or era. In addition, because he arranges for a beautifully clear flow of ideas, arguments, and debates, those working on free will and agency in contemporary philosophy can benefit from seeing some familiar controversies unfold in a different context.