Free Will and Theism: Connections, Contingencies, and Concerns

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Kevin Timpe and Daniel Speak (eds.), Free Will and Theism: Connections, Contingencies, and Concerns, Oxford University Press, 2016, 316pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198743958.

Reviewed by David P. Hunt, Whittier College


The intersection of free will and theism is a rich territory for philosophical exploration, and the essays commissioned for this volume all contribute toward mapping that territory. But there is also a more interesting motivation for the collection, as the editors confess: it's to address the "suspicion within the community of philosophers working particularly on the problems of free will . . . that theistic beliefs are exerting an untoward influence upon the debates" (2).

This suspicion is arguably a special case of a more general suspicion, which the editors represent via an especially pointed quotation from Greg Dawes:

While the arguments put forward by many Christian philosophers are serious arguments, there is something less than serious about the spirit in which they are being offered. There is a direction in which those arguments will not be permitted to go. Arguments that support the faith will be seriously entertained; those that apparently undermine the faith must be countered, at any cost. Philosophy, to use the traditional phrase, is merely a 'handmaid' of theology. There is, to my mind, something frivolous about a philosophy of this sort. (2)

It's unclear just how to estimate a blanket charge like this one. (Insofar as there is any justice to it, there appears to be no less justice -- to my mind, at least -- in the parallel charge that results from substituting 'naturalism' for 'the faith,' etc.). In any case, the volume under review isn't concerned to address this more general charge, but only the relatively limited claim that philosophical debates about free will have been adversely affected by the theistic commitments of some of the participants in those debates.

As it happens, data from recent surveys of the beliefs of professional philosophers show "that theistic philosophers are significantly more likely to be libertarians than are atheists, and atheists are significantly more likely to be compatibilists than are theists" (3). One can only speculate about the causes of this correlation. There has been a marked turn toward Calvinism among Protestant theologians in the last few years, so it isn't theism per se that is correlated with libertarianism, but philosophical theism. This suggests that issues to which philosophers are especially sensitive may provide an explanatory link between the theism and libertarianism espoused in the surveys.

One obvious candidate is the logical problem of evil: the idea that there is a flat-out logical inconsistency in affirming divine omnipotence, omniscience, and omnibenevolence, on the one hand, and the existence of evil on the other. This problem is widely believed to have retreated before the free will defense, especially as marshalled by Alvin Plantinga. This defense, however, requires a libertarian understanding of free will; so theists wishing to avail themselves of the free will defense have a strong motivation for embracing libertarianism. The same is true for those wishing to go beyond mere defense to the construction of a positive theodicy like John Hick's soul-making theodicy, which presupposes an incompatibilist conception of free will. An adjunct of the problem of evil is the problem of divine hiddenness, as promulgated by John Schellenberg and others; this problem is very hard to resist without appeal to the extraordinary value of libertarian freedom. A final example may be found in the heaven-and-hell responsibility associated with traditional theism, which calls for an especially robust notion of free will, one that may be available only if libertarianism is true.

Suppose that libertarianism provides aid and comfort to theistic belief in just the ways identified. What of it? Manuel R. Vargas, in the volume's lead essay, argues that libertarian accounts of free will are largely the result of motivated reasoning. And we're not talking about the innocent motivation provided "by a desire for truth or accuracy;" rather, the reasoning in question is "biased" toward theism-friendly outcomes (29). Vargas calls such motivated reasoning "Runeberging," after a story by Jorge Luis Borges, and his "Runeberg hypothesis" is that the high correlation between libertarianism and theistic belief among professional philosophers can be explained by the motivated reasoning philosophical theists are tempted to deploy on behalf of libertarian free will. Since motivated reasoning rarely tracks the truth, we ought to be dubious of the libertarian accounts of free will that result from this reasoning.

It seems to me that worries based on the Runeberg hypothesis are overblown. Arguments for libertarianism -- for the conjunction of incompatibilism and free will -- are above-board, and they seldom appeal to theistic premises. Representative of such arguments is Peter van Inwagen's, perhaps the most famous and formidable of them all, in which incompatibilism rests on the Consequence Argument and free will is a precondition for genuine moral responsibility. It's unclear, then, what role an antecedent dubiety about libertarian arguments should play: we have the arguments and can assess them on their own merits. Perhaps the idea is that such arguments, though devoid of theistic premises, are more persuasive for theists on account of their bias toward the arguments' libertarian conclusion. But then we have to explain the arguments' persuasive force for the 42% of libertarians who are not theists. Moreover, Runeberging (as Vargas notes) is ubiquitous throughout philosophy; indeed, smart people in general seem especially prone to Runeberging. If there were some independent way to justify a strong presumption in favor of compatibilism, then libertarianism might require explanation in a way that compatibilism does not; but it's unclear what this independent justification might be. It can't be that an overwhelming majority of philosophers are compatibilists, because an overwhelming majority of philosophers are also atheists or agnostics. Libertarianism is arguably the default position on free will, the one that is prima facie most hospitable to our ordinary intuitions about agency. Insofar as this is the case, it's the persuasive power of compatibilist arguments for non-theistic philosophers that needs explanation.

The first two essays following Vargas's focus on the role of libertarian freedom in responses to the problem of evil. John Martin Fischer has often pointed out that, on incompatibilism, the affirmation of free will is vulnerable to the empirical discovery that determinism is true; insofar as that's disturbing, compatibilism enjoys a serious advantage. Here Fischer extends the point to the theist who depends on libertarianism for a defense against the problem of evil: belief in God and the defense of God's goodness in the face of evil shouldn't be vulnerable to empirical discoveries. Laura W. Ekstrom, though herself a libertarian, concurs with Fischer's critique of the role assigned to libertarian freedom in responding to the problem of evil. Libertarian freedom, while valuable, is not valuable enough to justify the kinds and amounts of evil that obtain -- we'll have to look elsewhere for a solution to the problem of evil (and libertarian theists should likewise look elsewhere to motivate their libertarianism).

The next four essays are more or less in dialogue with each other on the question whether theistic belief provides reasons for preferring libertarianism. Jerry L. Walls argues that it does, largely on the grounds that the actions of creatures with compatibilist free will would be the result of manipulation, an idea that is difficult to square with the traditional Christian doctrine that some will be damned. Tamler Sommers and Derk Pereboom disagree. Sommers maintains that the complexity of our concept(s) of moral responsibility undermines Walls's position; so does the complexity of the Biblical data, which are very hard to account for in their totality if we limit ourselves to either a libertarian or a compatibilist understanding of free will. Pereboom is, like Walls, an incompatibilist; but, unlike Walls, he is a universalist about salvation, so he is unmoved by Walls's particular brief on behalf of libertarian freedom. Instead, Pereboom reviews some of the benefits of theological determinism while arguing that its costs (the loss of genuine free will and moral responsibility) are not so dire as generally believed. A theological cost is the unavailability of Plantinga's free will defense, but here Pereboom is ready to invoke skeptical theism, a strategy that has to play at least some role in responses to the problem of evil even if one is a libertarian. Timothy O'Connor pushes back against Pereboom in the next essay, contending that skeptical theism must be exceedingly skeptical if it eschews a libertarian understanding of human agency, and citing Christian commitments that apparently require the ascription to human beings of free will. An example of the latter is a dilemma O'Connor poses regarding the Incarnation: if human beings lack free will, then either Jesus lacked it as well, or Jesus had it but is unrepresentative of human nature -- but both of these alternatives are theologically unacceptable.

T. J. Mawson then challenges the idea that theism has any implications one way or the other for free will; interestingly, he argues that the implications run in the other direction. Libertarianism should make theism more attractive. If Mawson is right, the explanation for the high correlation between theism and libertarianism is just the reverse of what Vargas proposes. As a libertarian who is also an atheist, Helen Steward has impeccable credentials for challenging the Runeberg hypothesis. According to Steward, it isn't theism but science that favors libertarianism: agency itself, including animal agency, is incompatible with determinism, but there are no grounds here for worrying about the prospects for genuine agency, since determinism is "a philosopher's mirage" (168). Unlike Mawson and Steward, Meghan Griffith does believe that theism favors libertarianism, but the focus of her essay is on the further question whether theism favors a particular kind of libertarianism. Her answer is that it favors agent-causal libertarianism.

The next three essays return to the compatibility question. Michael J. Almeida challenges the consensus that libertarian free will, as expounded in Plantinga's free will defense, solves the logical problem of evil. While God cannot directly cause someone S to perform an action A with libertarian freedom, God can directly cause himself to predict that S will perform A freely -- and because God is a perfect predictor, it follows in such worlds (worlds that God has the power to bring about) that S will perform A freely. Almeida concludes that transworld depravity, the possibility of which undergirds Plantinga's position, is in fact necessarily false. The next two essays consider how creaturely free agency can be compatible with classic Christian teaching about God's intimate causal involvement in creation. W. Matthews Grant's concern is with the "doctrine of divine universal causality," on which God directly causes everything -- including human actions -- to exist as long as they exist. Grant develops a model on which God is able to pull off this feat without introducing any prior logically sufficient conditions for the action which would undermine the agent's free will and moral responsibility. Finally, Neal Judisch examines the doctrine of divine conservation of all things. A natural way to understand divine conservation is on the model of supervenience. Judisch looks closely at the parallels between the incompatibilist threats to free will posed by physical supervenience and causal determinism, and develops an alternative model of divine conservation on which it is unimplicated in this threat.

The volume concludes with three essays exploring the nature of divine freedom. Significantly, all three approach divine agency as the paradigm case of agency, meaning that the exploration has implications for human beings as well as for God. Rebekah L. H. Rice takes a different tack from the volume's supporters of agent-causal libertarianism, arguing that the role reasons should play in explaining action favors an event-causal account of agency. Kevin Timpe, in a judicious contribution to the volume he has co-edited, takes God as a model of how actions flowing from an agent's character can be free. Jesse Couenhoven has the final word, setting aside the compatibilism question to argue for a non-volitionist account of freedom combined with a normative constraint according to which the telos of freedom is the good.

It's hard to convey in such summary fashion the richness of this collection. It should be essential reading for theistic philosophers interested in the intersection of theism and free will. But what about the charge of Runeberging that frames the volume? Skeptics about theistic bias might find that the volume's contents don't so much respond to the charge as exemplify it. After all, here's a book consisting largely (if not exclusively) of essays by theists engaged in motivated reasoning about free will! Nevertheless, it seems to me that this collection should be of considerable interest to non-theists who want to see what the big crossword puzzle -- at least that part of the crossword puzzle that concerns free agency -- looks like when philosophers with different commitments from theirs endeavor to fill in some of the squares. That interest in how things look under an alternative set of assumptions is the essence of the philosophical spirit, the Runeberg hypothesis notwithstanding.