Free Will as an Open Scientific Problem

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Mark Balaguer, Free Will as an Open Scientific Problem, MIT Press, 2010, 202pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262013543.

Reviewed by Joseph Keim Campbell, Washington State University



1. Introduction

Mark Balaguer’s Free Will as an Open Scientific Problem is a must-read for anyone working in free will, or metaphysics in general. Balaguer offers a set of provocative solutions to problems about free will and provides the welcome beginnings of something more. The main views can be summarized as follows:

(1) "the metaphysical issue inherent in the problem of free will and determinism comes down to … the which-kinds-of-freedom1-do-we-have question" (165-6).

(2) “the which-kinds-of-freedom-do-we-have question reduces largely (though not entirely … ) to … the question of whether humans are L-free” (166), where L-freedom is a kind of libertarian freedom (incompatible with determinism).

(3) “the question of whether humans are L-free comes down to the purely empirical question … of whether TDW-indeterminism is true” (166), where TDW-indeterminism is the thesis that "Some of our torn decisions are wholly undetermined at the moment of choice" (78).

(4) “we currently have no good reason to accept or reject TDW-indeterminism” (166).

From these, various other claims appear to follow. Three are of interest to me:

(A) There is no compelling reason to deny that humans have free will.

(B) “the metaphysically interesting issue in the problem of free will and determinism boils down to a straightforward (and wide open) empirical question about the causal histories of certain neural events” (1).

© "there are no distinctly metaphysical facts" (169), at least when it comes to claims about free will and moral responsibility.

Balaguer never explicitly mentions (A), perhaps the most intriguing part of his project. (B) and © are more contentious, more bold, more fully developed, and lie at the heart of Balaguer’s anti-metaphysical approach to free will and his more general neo-positivism. Balaguer writes: “all so-called metaphysical questions boil down to questions that are either (a) straightforwardly empirical questions about the nature of the physical world, or (b) straightforwardly logical questions, or © factually empty questions” (169).

What follows is an explication and critique of Balaguer’s project. By way of full disclosure, I am a compatibilist although my approach is more methodological than partisan. I’m just an argument away from incompatibilism. Compatibilism has advantages, all other things being equal, for it requires one fewer necessary condition for free will. This points to a tension in Balaguer’s book. On the one hand, we should conclude that the compatibility problem — the problem of whether free will is compatible with determinism — is relatively unimportant. Balaguer describes a kind of freedom — L-freedom — that is essentially incompatibilist. Balaguer is not committed to incompatibilism, because he doesn’t claim that L-freedom is free will, yet given the central role of L-freedom in his theory the compatibility problem seems to matter. I can’t help but think the project would be better placed within a compatibilist framework. Indeed, at the end of the review I argue that Balaguer is committed to compatibilism.

2. Problems and Questions about Free Will

The best way to understand Balaguer’s theory is to understand the problems and questions that interest him as well as the ones that don’t. Consider “the traditional problem of free will and determinism” (3):

Determinism is true (i.e., every event is causally necessitated by prior events together with causal laws);

Human beings have free will; and

Free will is incompatible with determinism (1-2).

Each individual claim seems true yet they are mutually inconsistent. Balaguer acknowledges the worry but develops a “new and improved version of the problem of free will” and determinism:

FE-determinism is true (i.e., libertarianism is false).

Human beings have free will.

Free will is incompatible with determinism (and, hence, with FE-determinism) (13; 15).

According to FE-determinism (short for “No Freedom-Enhancing Indeterminism”), “There are no freedom-enhancing indeterminacies,” or more explicitly, "there are no undetermined events in our decision making processes that generate or increase appropriate nonrandomness" (12).

There are two important differences between the new and improved version and the traditional problem of free will and determinism. The traditional problem held that determinism was true but now the claim is only that libertarianism is false. Further, the third proposition in the new and improved version is revised. Overall there is a shift in focus from the truth of determinism to the absence of libertarian freedom.

Another problem that captures Balaguer’s attention is the “free will” crisis: there is no generally endorsed meaning of “free will” (Campbell forthcoming, Ch. 2). Balaguer adds that there is not even an agreed upon method of determining its meaning (Ch. 2). Two responses to this crisis are monism and pluralism.2 According to monism, all philosophers — compatibilists and incompatibilists — mean the same thing when they use the term “free will” (van Inwagen 2008). Pluralists note that the literature includes multiple and contrary varieties of freedom. Each variety of freedom may be interesting and worth wanting, whether or not it counts as the meaning of “free will.” For each we may ask: Is that kind of freedom required for moral responsibility?, etc.

Balaguer favors pluralism and the Hybrid View (36), which is stipulative. He makes a strong case that the meaning of “free will” is an empirical matter settled by ordinary usage (and possibly various other factors) (32ff.). Hence, the compatibility problem is an empirical issue too. If “free will” means libertarian free will, compatibilism is false; if it means Humean free will, compatibilism is true (4ff.). What we should care about is “the nature of the freedom that’s inherent in human decision-making processes,” which is also ultimately an empirical matter (54).

3. Torn Decisions

Balaguer develops a libertarian theory of freedom but he makes it clear that he is just developing the theory and not necessarily endorsing it (69). It has two essential and interrelated parts. One is TDW-indeterminism (see section 1 above). The other is the thesis that “if our torn decisions are wholly undetermined in the manner of TDW-indeterminism,” then they are L-free because

(a) they are sufficiently rational to count as L-free; (b) we author and control them; © the indeterminacy increases or procures the authorship and/or control; and (d) the indeterminacy-enhanced authorship and control that we get here is worth wanting (119).

Thus, L-freedom is a freedom worth wanting that is essentially indeterministic. Balaguer doesn’t commit to the claim that L-freedom is required for moral responsibility, but he says that if we have L-freedom, then we have the kind of freedom we need to be morally responsible for our actions. Whether we have L-freedom boils down to the empirical question of whether our torn decisions are undetermined in the right way.

Torn decisions have two main phenomenological components. First, the agent “has reasons for two or more options and feels torn as to which set of reasons is strongest, that is, has no conscious belief as to which option is best, given her reasons.” In addition, the person “decides without resolving this conflict — that is, the person has the experience of ‘just choosing’” (71). Torn decisions are opposed to Buridan’s-ass decisions, where "the reasons for the various tied-for-best options are the same reasons" (72): equal desires for two piles of hay, for instance. In these cases “the agent doesn’t feel torn as to which option is best” (73). Torn decisions are similar to Kane’s self-forming actions (1996) but there are several differences worth noting (73ff.).

The key is that torn decisions are such that “If they are undetermined at the moment of choice … , then they are L-free” (68). This is because if our torn decisions are undetermined in the right way, they are (a) “appropriately nonrandom” and (b) “the indeterminacy in question increases or procures the appropriate nonrandomness” (68). Balaguer claims that "if our torn decisions are undetermined at the moment of choice, then (a) and (b) are true" (69). It is for this reason that “the question of whether libertarianism is true just reduces to the question of whether some of our torn decisions are undetermined in the appropriate way” (69), an empirical question “about whether certain neural events are undetermined” (70).

4. The Problem of Luck

My concerns are about authorship and control, the most fundamental freedoms that Balaguer discusses. First, why think that if our torn decisions are undetermined in the right way that the indeterminacy increases or procures the agent’s authorship and control? Second, is it possible that determinism might procure authorship and control? These questions correspond to the two parts of Peter van Inwagen’s problem of free will (2008): the problem of luck (1983, section 4.4) plus the compatibility problem (1983, Ch. III). The first question is discussed here and the second question in the next section.

According to Balaguer, if our torn decisions are undetermined in the right way, then this is “a freedom-enhancing sort of indeterminism” (79). I’m skeptical that Balaguer has established this claim. Distinguish between these two proposals:

First proposal: If our torn decisions are undetermined in the right way, then we have as much authorship and control over them as we do over decisions that are determined by our reasons (cf. 96);

Second proposal: If our torn decisions are not undetermined in the right way (for instance, if they are determined), then we have less authorship and control over them than we do if they are undetermined in the right way (cf. 100).

Balaguer makes a good case for the first proposal but one might accept it even if one thinks humans lack authorship and control. Balaguer attempts to establish the second proposal (3.3.2) but this touches on the compatibility problem, discussed later.

Some reasons for doubting the second proposal arise from the problem of luck, which Balaguer discusses (92). Here is van Inwagen’s example:

does postulating or asserting that the laws of nature are indeterministic provide any comfort to those who would like to believe in metaphysical freedom? If the laws are indeterministic, then more than one future is indeed consistent with those laws and the actual past and present — but how can anyone have any choice about which of these becomes actual? Isn’t it a matter of chance which becomes actual? If God were to ‘return’ an indeterministic world to precisely its state at some time in the past, and then let the world go forward again, things might indeed happen differently the ‘second’ time. But then, if the world is indeterministic, isn’t it just a matter of chance how things did happen in the one, actual course of events? And if what we do is just a matter of chance — well, who would want to call that freedom? (1998; cf. 1983)

There is a related story illustrating the compatibility problem. Suppose that God ‘returns’ the world to the same state 100 times over and each time things turn out the same. We’d think that our acts were compulsive rather than free. The two stories can be combined. Suppose you make a choice between two alternatives 100 times over and each time the choice is the same. Compulsion. Suppose now you split the choice, half the time choosing one option, half the time the other. Luck.

We can distinguish between two claims, either of which might follow given the problem of luck. According to the strong conclusion, "freedom requires determinism" (6). Balaguer offers a consistent and plausible model of indeterministic freedom, lending support to the denial of the strong conclusion. According to a weaker conclusion, the problem of luck casts doubt on the prospects of indeterminism increasing or procuring the required authorship and control of our actions. It casts doubt on the second proposal, which is a comparative judgment: we have less authorship and control in cases of determinism than in cases of indeterminism. Which leads to the final topic.

5. The Compatibility Problem

I wonder whether indeterminism is a necessary component of Balaguer’s story. Nothing in Balaguer’s theory commits him to incompatibilism. L-freedom is an essentially incompatibilist variety of freedom yet that is a matter of stipulation. Still, the compatibility problem looms throughout Balaguer’s book. Recall the second proposal (roughly): If our torn decisions are determined, we have less authorship and control. Why accept this claim?

Balaguer makes two points in support of the second proposal. First, conscious choice in the case of our torn decisions provides prima facie evidence of authorship and control. It seems as if, when an agent is making a torn decision, he is “doing the just-choosing” (97). Second, determinism results in a decrease of authority and control even if it does not explicitly rule out freedom (104-5). Balaguer prefers indeterminism (under the right circumstances) over determinism because the undetermined agent is “not causally influenced (at the moment of choice) by any factor external to his conscious reasons and thought” (101). The presumption appears to be that if a decision is causally determined by factors external to the agent — such as events in the remote past together with the laws of nature — then this detracts from the agent’s authority and control. I’m reminded of no-choice transfer principles, like van Inwagen’s (β) (1983, 94).

Let me conclude by offering the possibility of a more basic freedom underlying L-freedom. Call it “X-freedom” (167). A person has X-freedom iff he has authorship and control over his actions (cf. 87; 94). L-freedom is the indeterministic manifestation of X-freedom but X-freedom is a compatibilist theory.

Even Balaguer thinks that authority and control is possible given determinism. Consider the case of Brandy, who has three choices for dinner: a salmon dish, a mushroom dish, and a beef dish. She strongly prefers the latter over the others, so “this choice was causally determined by her … preferences” (124). Balaguer adds that in cases like this,

determination by reasons is … what we should want, and this includes libertarians. My argument for this is that it is only through determination by reasons that we can get a guarantee that, in cases like Brandy’s, we author and control our decisions. For if reasons don’t determine our choices in cases like this, then that just opens the door to the possibility … of something happening against Brandy’s wishes (127).

Balaguer accepts that we have authorship and control in cases of determinism. Furthermore, he does not think that such authorship and control need trace back to some previous torn decision (124). Hence, the authorship and control is not increased or procured by some prior indeterminism. It is possible that the same act might be both determined and free. If this is not a commitment to compatibilism, I’m not sure what is.

It is not too surprising that I see the consequence argument, and thus the compatibility problem, everywhere in Balaguer’s book. Nonetheless, I remain hopeful about the future prospects of philosophical analysis. Criticisms aside, this is a very interesting project, one that deserves attention. The book is a model of precision and clarity. It is accessible to the beginning student and makes an important contribution to scholarship in free will and metaphysics. Given the difficult nature of these topics, this is impressive. 3


Campbell, Joseph Keim. Forthcoming. Free Will. Polity Press.

Kane, Robert. 1996. The Significance of Free Will. Oxford UP.

Van Inwagen, Peter. 2008. “How to Think about the Problem of Free Will.” Journal of Ethics 12: 337-41.

———. 1998. “The Mystery of Metaphysical Freedom.” In Metaphysics: The Big Questions, edited by Peter van Inwagen and Dean Zimmerman. Blackwell Publishers.

———. 1983. An Essay on Free Will. Clarendon Press.

1 Most of the freedoms that Balaguer discusses are at least candidates for the title “free will”: libertarian freedom, Humean freedom (4), Frankfurtian freedom (5), etc.

2 Balaguer offered this terminology in correspondence.

3 An earlier draft of this review was presented the University of Idaho as part of the WSU/UI Philosophy Colloquium series. Thanks to Nicole Brunson, Justin Caouette, Ryan Hebert, Douglas Lind, Shairylann Lisonbee, Daniel Mistak, Michael Myers, and Michael O’Rourke for questions. Brunson, Caouette, Justin Horn, O’Rourke, and V. Alan White provided helpful comments on a subsequent revision. Thanks especially to Mark Balaguer for commenting extensively on several drafts.