Free Will in Philosophical Theology

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Kevin Timpe, Free Will in Philosophical Theology, Bloomsbury, 2014, 177pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781501308680.

Reviewed by Derk Pereboom, Cornell University, and Leigh Vicens, Augustana College


There is much to admire in Kevin Timpe's book. It brings philosophers and Christian theologians into deeper conversation about such issues of shared interest as autonomy, responsibility, desert, meaning, and value. The book follows the traditional theological pattern of exitus reditus -- "the coming forth . . . of all things from God, and the return . . . of all things . . . to God as to the ultimate goal". This fits his subject matter, and makes for a delightful read, as he "tell[s] a theological story philosophically" (3).

Clearly laying out his metaphysical assumptions at the beginning, Timpe understands freedom as the control condition for moral responsibility (7), and assumes a source incompatibilist position (which he has defended elsewhere (2008)), according to which (a) an agent's choice is free only if nothing outside of her is the ultimate cause of that choice (8), and (b) because of this, freedom is incompatible with both causal and theological determinism (9). He also favors a version of libertarianism which he calls "virtue libertarianism," according to which an agent bears responsibility for a choice that is determined by her character, so long as she had a hand in shaping that character by her past free choices (11); on his version of virtue libertarianism, such choices when determined by one's self-formed character also count as free (see, e.g., 87). Finally, Timpe assumes a "reasons constraint on free choice," according to which an agent is unable to freely choose to perform an action she sees no reason to do (17). While we are less confident about the extent of libertarian human freedom than Timpe is, we think these are reasonable assumptions to make when attempting to explicate traditional Christian theology.

Especially impressive are his accounts of divine freedom and the perfected freedom of redeemed humanity, laid out in Chapters 6 and 7. Timpe argues that even though God's essential moral goodness rules out the ability to do evil, God is still free; indeed divine freedom is the model for our own (112). For God is not determined by anything external to the divine nature to choose or act (109). Though Timpe does not discuss this issue, we assume he thinks that the (necessary) truths of morality in some way exist "within" God, or depend on God's (necessary) existence, such that even if God has moral obligations, this does not imply that something outside of God is a sufficient condition for divine actions. And Timpe need not even concede that God's nature necessitates those actions, since he allows for the possibility that God is simple -- that is, that there is no distinction between God's existence and essence, or, as Timpe puts it, "between God and God's moral character" (111). Likewise, he cogently argues that we need not say that the redeemed in heaven lack free will just because they are no longer able to sin. For they are at least partly responsible for the formation of the moral character that now precludes being able to will evil.

The issues about which we disagree with Timpe are found in Chapters 3 and 5. We won't discuss Chapter 4 in which Timpe offers an account of the conversion (or absence thereof) of a person from a state of fallenness to a state of grace. The details of this account are quite complex, since Timpe is trying to meet a number of desiderata he has set for himself, including the requirement that those in the fallen state are free but unable to will or cause any good on their own, and that they are in control of whether they come to have saving faith (which is, in his view, good), such that it is not God but they who are responsible if they fail to be saved. We refer those interested to an incisive criticism of this account presented in Simon Kittle's "Grace and Free Will: Quiescence and Control" with which we largely agree. In the rest of this review we raise some questions for Timpe regarding his discussion of how the first sin originated, and how some individuals end up eternally damned.

In Chapter 3 Timpe examines how the first sin might have originated, assuming the truth of his reasons-constraint on free choice. Note that an account of moral responsibility for primal sin has independent interest insofar as it will yield an explanation of non-derivative moral responsibility for wrongdoing. Timpe addresses two proposals by contemporary scholars explicating medieval views, Scott MacDonald's (1998) Augustinian intellectualist account (41-46), and Katherin Rogers's (2008) Anselmian voluntarist alternative (37-41), and in each case finds unintelligibility at the core of the proposal. On MacDonald's account, the explanation of the willing of the primal sin is a failure in attentiveness. Primal sinners fail "to pay attention to the reason they had for loving God above all things, namely, their knowledge that God is the highest good. Had they attended to the reasons they possessed, they would have seen that rationality required them to love God above all things" (1998: 120-21) (43). Both Timpe and Rogers point out, correctly we think, that either the failure to pay attention is a voluntary omission on the part of the agent, for which he could be responsible, or if it's not a voluntary omission, it's something that merely happens to the agent. Given Augustine's and MacDonald's non-voluntarist commitments, the failure to pay attention is not a voluntary omission. Yet the sinner is morally responsible for it. One might now be tempted to characterize the sinner's responsibility for the failure to pay attention as an unexplained mystery. But this isn't plausible, as Timpe argues (45-46), at least given libertarianism, since on this view an agent cannot be non-derivatively responsible for something that merely happens to her.

Rogers (2008) sets out the voluntarist alternative in an Anselmian framework, in which, as in the Augustinian view, whenever we act we do so conceiving the action as good. According to Anselm there are two distinct dimensions of good that potentially conflict, benefit and justice. When we act wrongly, we will a benefit that we should not have willed because it conflicts with justice. This dual notion of the good yields an advantage over a view on which there is only a single dimension of goodness, because an agent can be fully aware of the relevant goods and still see an option that is overall inferior as best in one dimension, for example, in the dimension of benefit as self-interest. Her seeing it as best in this dimension can then explain why she acts for its sake.

Anselm's paradigm example is the primal sin of Satan, and here it's assumed that he doesn't lack any relevant knowledge, moral or non-moral. On the voluntarist option, primal sin cannot be explained by ignorance, for either the ignorance exculpates or is derivative of an earlier voluntary sin, in which case our target sin wasn't really primal after all. Rather, a primal sin will be a voluntary act that does not result from ignorance. But both Rogers and Timpe find an undermining unintelligibility in the voluntarist account as well. However, we don't think that, properly understood, the voluntarist account features this sort of unintelligibility.

Suppose the choice at issue is to rebel against God. Satan understands that there is a reason not to rebel, i.e., that it would be unjust. As he sees it, there is also reason to rebel, that it stands to benefit him, say by increasing the chance that he will become more powerful. It's clear that Satan's choice to rebel is intelligible by virtue of this reason, and also that the choice not to rebel would be intelligible by virtue of the reason that refraining from rebelling would be just. We think that this is a type of intelligibility that survives criticism, and a valuable kind of intelligibility to which the libertarian can ultimately appeal. But Timpe, with Rogers, appears to believe that there is in addition a choice that can't be made intelligible in this way: the choice between sin and justice. And on Rogers's view, Anselm is limited to "only because he chose" as a response to the request to make this choice intelligible (Rogers 2008, 96-8) (39-40).

However, for some kinds of choice, this is intuitively the only answer to one key question. Suppose I've narrowed down my ice-cream preferences to strawberry and chocolate. I don't prefer one to the other, but I prefer having ice cream to going without. Suppose I choose chocolate. Rogers might ask: Why did you choose chocolate? I say: because I like it. She then persists: "Why did you choose chocolate rather than strawberry?" My answer is: I just chose it. So we have two requests for intelligibility to consider, one to which there is a satisfactory answer ("Because I like it") and the other to which the answer at least initially seems in one respect vacuous ("I just chose it").

On reflection, however, one can see that these two answers amount to a set of responses that leaves no account-undermining remainder of unintelligibility. One suggestion for such a remaining unintelligibility results from the assumption that there must be a sufficient cause for every actual event. If there is indeed a sufficient cause for choosing chocolate, citing this sufficient cause will yield an answer to the question: Why did you choose chocolate rather than strawberry? But this sufficient-cause assumption is ruled out in this context by libertarianism itself. In fact, in this situation, given libertarianism, it's natural to expect that there would be no answer other than "I just chose it" to the request for a contrastive explanation.

Accordingly, we might imagine that Satan found himself, due to no fault of his own, with equally strong preferences for increased power and for the just outcome, but that he could have either rebelled or refrained from rebellion by his free will. Let's call this the equipoise case. Here the answer to the question, "Why did Satan choose to rebel?", is: "He wanted more power. " To the question, "Why did he choose to rebel rather than not?", the answer is: "He just chose it." But as in the ice-cream case, given libertarian commitments, it's natural to expect that there would be no other answer.

It's plausible, however, that in the paradigm case of sin the agent is not indifferent between sinning and not sinning, but instead prefers the expected outcome of the sinful action to that of the just action. Satan would then prefer his increased power to the just outcome -- and his motivations for rebelling and not rebelling would not be in equipoise. An option here is for the libertarian to agree that God created Satan with the preference to rebel or with a more general motivational source of this preference, but with the power to resist it in view of its injustice. So, then, in the moment of choice, Satan understands that rebelling is unjust, but he prefers it due to no fault of his own. He freely chooses to act in accord with his preference, a choice for which he is then blameworthy -- he could, after all, have avoided this choice by his free will. Let's call this the sinful preference case.

In the sinful preference case, a contrastive explanation in terms of a sufficient cause for the choice to rebel is not available, as in the equipoise case, but such an explanation is already ruled out by libertarianism. However, another kind of contrastive explanation is available in the sinful preference case: Satan chose to rebel because he preferred his increased power to the just outcome. But still, he could have avoided this choice. We think that both the equipoise and sinful preference accounts of primal sin are contenders, and that neither leaves a residue of unintelligibility given libertarianism and natural expectations for action explanation.

Our other criticism targets Timpe's defense of the traditional doctrine of hell -- or, what he considers a "minimal" version of the traditional doctrine (70). Timpe says he wants to defend the claim that once a person is in hell, it is not possible for her to escape, even on the assumption that those in hell retain their free will, and that God does not cease to offer them the grace necessary for salvation. As with his account of heaven, Timpe defends what has been called a "settled character theory of hell" (71). Following Jonathan Kvanvig (2011: ch. 6, 14), he proposes that "Presence in hell is a result of one's choices, and in the process of choosing in such a way as to end up there, one turns oneself into the kind of person for whom it is psychologically impossible to choose to leave" (71). The damned have become the kind of people who will never freely choose to stop resisting God's offer of grace (72). This seems a very unfortunate state of affairs, and one might wonder, if God truly cares about all creatures and wants what is best for them, why God doesn't overpower their will and make them into the kind of people they ought to be -- the kind of people fit for union with God in heaven. Timpe's response is that to be in union with God, one must love God; but love, he says, requires an act of free will; it cannot be imposed from the outside (81). However, this answer, while it may seem initially plausible, raises a number of difficulties.

First, Timpe's account of freedom does not commit him to the claim that love requires an act of free will. His view is consistent with the possibility that we might be causally determined to love. The proximal causes of such love would, presumably, be "within" us -- that is, arising from our own character. Our attractions, interests, desires and the like might draw us to someone whose personality or other features especially appeal to us, and this might be the basis of our love of them -- of our caring about them, wanting to be intimate with them, and so on. But then it is unclear why, for our attitude toward them to count as true love, the character grounding our love must be freely formed to begin with. So long as a person is motivated in the characteristic ways by appropriate feelings, beliefs, and desires, she would seem to be in love, no matter what the ultimate origin of these motivating states of mind. Furthermore, it seems that in fact we often are determined to love -- that is, to truly love -- other people in our lives, such as our family members (Pereboom 2001: 202-04).

Second, it's not clear that, on Timpe's characterization of the state of the damned, they really are free, even according to his account of freedom. In responding to one objection regarding the implausibility of thinking that anyone would eternally choose to reject God, Timpe discusses the "bondage of sin" that those in the fallen state are under, and quotes Raymond VanArragon (2011): "it may be possible for [a person] to freely make some choice . . . which has the consequence of rendering her forever unable to freely accept God. . . . Such a situation may be similar to that of a drug user who crosses the threshold into uncontrollable addiction" (80). But while someone could, through her own free choices, come to such a state of uncontrollable addiction, we think it's implausible that in that state the agent would still be free, contrary to what Timpe maintains (70). Indeed, the idea that she is in bondage to her addiction suggests the opposite: that she has freely brought herself into a state in which she lacks freedom. This is not to say that an agent must be able to do otherwise at the time of her action to count as acting freely, but only that one who is motivated to take heroin solely by an addiction is not truly the source of her action. The same might be said of an agent whose sin has left her in such a state that it is eternally impossible for her to appreciate divine goodness and desire union with God.

But suppose that Timpe is right, that it is possible for someone to eternally freely choose to remain in hell. A third question is: Why God couldn't simply momentarily take away her freedom, and then give it back to her after converting her? Here's an analogy: suppose someone, of her own free will, becomes addicted to heroin, and refuses to give it up. And suppose for it to be psychologically possible for her to see the good of maintaining her job, marriage, and other relationships and activities, she must give up the drug. Imagine, then, that her husband forcibly takes the drug away from her and commits her to therapy that rids her of her addiction. She then regains the freedom to choose to continue her relationships and activities, or to end them. Couldn't God do something similar with those who would otherwise be eternally damned -- wipe the slate clean, as it were, and give them a second chance at redemption?

Finally, even supposing that God could not take away and then give back people's freedom in this way, and supposing that, without freedom, they would not be able to enter a loving relationship with God, we wonder why God must consign them to hell, rather than permanently take away their freedom and put them in some other place -- a place where there is no sin or suffering. If, as Timpe admits, freedom is not an intrinsic good (84), but valuable mainly insofar as it makes possible the development of moral virtue (108) and the ability to be in union with God, then on the assumption that certain people will not use their freedom for these goods, but only for ill, what sense does it make for God to allow them to retain their freedom and be in such an unfortunate state?

We look forward to further discussion of the issues that Timpe has so boldly and brilliantly taken. Even if one disagrees with some of the views he defends, this book is highly valuable since it sets out a coherent and attractive position with clarity and skill.


Kittle, Simon (forthcoming). "Grace and Free Will: Quiescence and Control," Journal of Analytic Theology.

Kvanvig, Jonathan (2011). Destiny and Deliberation. Oxford University Press.

MacDonald, Scott (1998). "Primal Sin," in Gareth Matthews, ed. The Augustinian Tradition. University of California Press.

Pereboom, Derk (2001). Living without Free Will. Cambridge University Press.

Rogers, Katherin (2008). Anselm on Freedom. Oxford University Press.

Timpe, Kevin (2008). Free Will: Sourcehood and its Alternatives. Continuum.

VanArragon, Raymond (2011). "Is it Possible to Freely Reject God Forever?" in Joel Buenting (ed), The Problem of Hell. Ashgate, pp. 29-43.