Free Will Skepticism in Law and Society: Challenging Retributive Justice

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Elizabeth Shaw, Derk Pereboom, and Gregg D. Caruso (eds.), Free Will Skepticism in Law and Society: Challenging Retributive Justice, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 238pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108493475.

Reviewed by Kelly McCormick, Texas Christian University


Elizabeth Shaw, Derk Pereboom, and Gregg D. Caruso have compiled a volume that centralizes a question of great philosophical and practical importance -- what is the relationship between skeptical views about free will and criminal punishment? It provides an excellent new resource for anyone who finds some variety of free will skepticism appealing (or troubling), and thus feels a looming threat to retributive justification for our modern criminal justice system.

The volume is divided into three main sections. In Part I, Saul Smilansky, Caruso, and Bruce N. Waller focus on identifying and assessing the pragmatic implications of endorsing some variety of free will skepticism. Here some initial clarification about the nature of free will skepticism itself is in order. While there are a variety of ways that we might understand the motivation for free will skepticism and its ultimate scope, the majority of contributors here accept something akin to Pereboom's version. For those unfamiliar with the position, it is a relatively cautious variety of skepticism. According to Pereboom, the troubles for traditional success theories of free will and moral responsibility suggest that, at best, we have no good reason to think that we ever have the kind of freedom needed to make us morally responsible and deserving of praise and blame in the basic (non-consequentialist) sense. In other words, the assumption that we sometimes genuinely deserve backward-looking, retributive blame for our actions is unfounded. And, in light of the significant harms associated with this kind of blame and its attendant practices (perhaps foremost among them, punishment) we ought to take seriously the skeptical position that they are in fact never truly deserved. All of the contributors to this volume proceed under the assumption that taking this kind of skepticism seriously will require significant revision to our current thinking about the modes of punishment that we can justify.

Smilansky ("Free Will Denial and Deontological Constraints") kicks off the discussion of the possible implications of adopting free will skepticism. He defends the only "pessimistic" position in the volume, making a case for thinking that the situation for skeptics may be more dire than often assumed. Of particular worry for Smilansky is the potential threat of skepticism to the stability of our deontological constraints on punishment. Skeptics are in the uncomfortable speculative position of, at best, hoping our commitment to things like the wrongness of harming the innocent can be sustained in the absence of beliefs about responsible agency -- beliefs that seem to have been doing the work of sustaining them for the bulk of human history. Even worse, Smilansky argues that we have good statistical reason for thinking that free will skepticism justifies aggressively preventative methods for reducing crime, methods that will necessarily increase the risk of punishing the innocent (38).

Next, Caruso ("Free Will Skepticism and Its Implications: An Argument for Optimism") and Waller ("Beyond the Retributive System") offer optimistic responses to Smilansky. Both appeal to empirical support for thinking that belief in free will has a "dark side," and correlates with other independently problematic beliefs (54). Caruso emphasizes the correlation with Just World Beliefs (roughly the idea that we live in a world in which people usually get what they deserve), and beliefs associated with Right Wing Authoritarianism (such as the assumption that authorities are usually right, and that we are in need of powerful leaders willing to "do what needs to be done") (54). In light of these correlations Caruso argues that belief in free will can encourage disproportionately harsh punishment, overlook the underlying systemic causes of criminal behavior, and ultimately excuse and perpetuate deeply problematic social and economic inequalities. With a clearer picture of the dark side of the belief in free will in hand, Caruso then defends a public-health quarantine model of criminal justice. This model places heavy emphasis on how inequities such as poverty, pre-existing medical conditions, mental illness, educational inequalities, and environmental health can causally contribute to criminal behavior. Identifying these inequities suggests a variety of potential opportunities for crime prevention (62).

Waller emphasizes the correlation between the belief that individuals justly deserve punishment and reward, belief in rugged individualism, and belief in a just world (79). He further contrasts the broadly Neoliberal worldview associated with this set of beliefs with social democratic alternatives. While the former is heavily grounded in retributivism and individualism, social democratic alternatives are instead oriented toward a more egalitarian perspective. These alternatives acknowledge that the world is not just, that offenders are often themselves the victims of systematic injustices, and promotes a greater willingness to assume collective responsibility for criminal offenses. Waller suggests that we follow the model of our social democratic counterparts to free ourselves from the problematic retributive systems that we are enmeshed in. In particular, we might shift our attention towards diagnosing the variety of systemic injustices that constitute the underlying causes of criminal behavior, while abandoning the false assumption that offenders are capable of the kind of self-creation that could render them responsible in the first place.

Caruso's and Waller's contributions have the dual merits of identifying pragmatic consequences largely overlooked in the standard free will literature thus far, as well as offering persuasive and nuanced suggestions for where to look for non-retributive alternatives that may make us significantly better off as a more egalitarian and compassionate society. Perhaps one worry worth flagging, though, is that the conclusions drawn regarding the relation between belief in free will and obviously problematic just world beliefs are too strong. While Caruso and Waller make persuasive cases for the relevant correlation, it is far from obvious that belief in free will plays a role in generating just world beliefs, or that it is a necessary condition for adopting them. If, for example, we have reason to think that the vast majority of non-skeptics -- especially the ordinary folk comprising the data that Caruso and Waller cite -- believe that we do have free will, then mere correlation won't tell us much at all. If the belief that we have free will turns out to be a near-universal background assumption of the folk, then we should expect it to correlate with any number of independently problematic beliefs. While the correlation cited does intuitively suggest a tighter causal connection underlying it, explicit argument in support of the latter would further strengthen the force of these arguments.

In Part II the focus of the volume shifts to questions about the possible justification for non-retributive alternatives to punishment. Here Pereboom ("Free Will Skepticism and Prevention of Crime") begins by presenting the most recent version of his quarantine model. In doing so he directly engages with Smilansky's worry that free will skepticism threatens to undermine the stability of our deontic constraints on punishment, especially the prohibition on punishing the innocent. Pereboom argues that the quarantine model can be justified by appeal to general deterrence and the right to self-defense, and the right to self-defense only allows for the detention of those who pose an actual threat. Because the innocent are by definition those who have not yet committed a crime or threatened to do so, they will pose no such threat. So, the quarantine model has at least resources for sustaining the deontological constraint that it is wrong to punish the innocent.

Benjamin Vilhauer ("Deontology and Deterrence for Free Will Deniers") addresses a distinct worry about the pragmatic implications of free will skepticism, namely, that non-retributive alternatives to punishment consequentially justified by general deterrence alone run the risk of sliding into "funishment" (117). Such alternatives are subject to what Pereboom calls a "principle of least infringement," the idea that once we have abandoned retributivism we must not unnecessarily hinder offenders' prospects for a life lived at a reasonable level of flourishing (105, 113). But then, rather than deterring violent crime, non-retributive alternatives such as quarantine might actually incentivize it. Vilhauer accepts the problem of funishment as a good reason for free will skeptics to seek deontological, rather than purely deterrent, justification for the non-retributive alternative to punishment that they endorse. He goes on to argue for a desert-free deontological hybrid view that has its roots in Kantian and Rawlsian considerations. According to Vilhauer we might justify non-retributive alternatives to punishment on the grounds that they are fair, where this means that we would choose these methods under the assumption that we are just as likely to be the offender as the victim (128).

In contrast, Kevin J. Murtagh ("Free Will Skepticism, General Deterrence, and the 'Use' Objection") argues that skeptics should go all in on general deterrence. It is often supposed that the use objection (general deterrence is wrong because it involves harming someone without their consent for the benefit of others) poses a serious threat to general deterrence. Murtagh argues that it does not. According to Murtagh, the use objection is often stated as if deterrent punishment were taking place in the state of nature. But, in regard to criminal punishment deterrence is part of a larger system. As part of this system it is only the threat of punishment, not punishment itself, that does the relevant deterring work. The system therefore does not require that we intend to harm any particular individual without their consent for the benefit of others, only that the system includes a plan to deter criminal behavior while also making potential offenders aware of the possible consequences of offending in advance. Murtagh concludes by arguing that Pereboom's quarantine model cannot deal adequately with lesser crimes, and that we ought to supplement his approach with further empirically supported methods of general deterrence such as increasing police presence in a "sentinel role" (156).

In Part III, Michael Louis Corrado, John Callender, Shaw, and Farah Focquaert examine how free will skepticism might apply to our actual criminal justice practices, and further how it might inform debates about the merits of corrective versus therapeutic models for the treatment of offenders. Corrado ("Fichte and Psychopathy: Criminal Justice Turned Upside Down") examines the recent "preventative turn" towards therapeutic and interventionist treatment of actual and potential offenders motivated by free will skepticism (162). While many of the contributors seem to find this turn appealing, Corrado argues that we do not (and should not) want to live in a world where preventative systems of punishment are the norm. While he agrees with skeptics that punishment cannot be justified retributively, preventative alternatives require "the manipulative techniques of the Brave New World" and would ultimately leave us with a world we do not want to live in (162). Corrado then uses the case of psychopaths to test the plausibility of an alternative Fichtean theory of criminal justice.

Callender ("Causality and Responsibility in Mentally Disordered Offenders") is the only contributor to take a straightforwardly clinical approach to questions about punishment by examining three case studies involving actual offenders. He argues that cases like these (and the ubiquity of others like them) suggest that our current retributive system of punishment often converts complex human tragedies into simple dichotomies of good or evil, guilt or innocence, sanity or insanity, and right or wrong. The first two cases Callender discusses highlight the fact that offenders are often themselves the victims of significant trauma, and that the current concept of legal insanity maps poorly onto the realities of mental illness. In stark contrast, the third case provides an example of a more therapeutic approach, resulting in the most effective and humane outcomes for the well-being of the offender in question.

Shaw ("The Implications of Free Will Skepticism for Establishing Criminal Liability") explores the implications of skepticism for the process of determining criminal liability at trial. She argues first that we should retain the three main requisites for criminal liability: actus rea, mens rea, and lack of a valid defense. Further, we can provide a rationale for each via appeal to non-desert-based considerations like the value of liberty and moral communication. Shaw also focuses on the prospects for three common defenses: self-defense, provocation, and mental disorder. She argues that all three could be retained under the assumption of free will skepticism, though perhaps with some revision to their rationale. The provocation defense can still be grounded in the justification of a variety of emotions other than retributive anger; self-defense must acknowledge that all aggressors are also the victims of bad luck and thus killing or injuring all aggressors may not be always be justified, and the capacity for moral dialogue can be used to determine the scope of mental illness defenses (200-205).

Finally, Focquaert ("Free Will Skepticism and Criminal Punishment: A Preliminary Ethical Analysis") analyzes our options for non-desert based criminal justice procedures that could still be fair and just for all parties involved. She examines the contours and implications for four models in particular: an illusionary model, a non-retributive moral responsibility model, a symbolic responsibility model, and a guiltless criminal justice model. While each model has its own package of costs and benefits to victims, offenders, and society, Focquaert concludes that the best model will be one that includes identification of causal responsibility, incentives for taking responsibility for future behavior, and methods for adequately addressing the rights and needs of victims.

One worry highlighted in Part III is that many of these issues suggest a tension between our empathy for offenders and our respect for victims. On one hand, significant portions of Callender's, Shaw's, and Focquaert's chapters highlight the inhumane view we often adopt toward offenders, the drastic ways that our current practices fail to fit the realities of mental illness, and the fact that we often overlook the way that traumatic histories contribute to violent crime and other offenses. Here skeptics do well to emphasize that offenders are often victims themselves, and that retributive punishment problematically sweeps the obligations that society has to them as such under the rug. On the other hand, Corrado's contribution suggests that even offenders themselves may not be willing to accept therapeutic and preventative alternatives, and that such alternatives might threaten their dignity in other ways. Focquaert's analysis suggests a potentially chilling question for non-retributive alternatives across the board. For any incremental move in the direction of empathy for offenders, do we necessarily run the risk of undermining respect for victims and our duties to them? Surely we ought not lower the volume on the voices of the latter overwhelmingly in service of the former.[1] Finding a balance will no doubt be incredibly difficult, and one of the great merits of the work found here is that it brings into sharp focus the many reasons we have to do so.

Overall, this is an excellent volume that will be of interest to a wide audience. In bringing together this collection, Shaw, Pereboom, and Caruso help to bridge the gap between those who find free will skepticism plausible and those working explicitly on punishment and applied issues for theories of criminal justice.

[1] It is perhaps a bit puzzling that rape and sexual assault are used as an example of violent crime repeatedly in many of the chapters, and yet there is little to no discussion of the testimony of actual victims. Here I recommend Chanel Miller's Know My Name as an excellent and eloquent resource.