Free Will: Sourcehood and Its Alternatives

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Kevin Timpe, Free Will: Sourcehood and Its Alternatives, Continuum, 2008, 155pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826496256.

Reviewed by C. P. Ragland, Saint Louis University


This book provides an excellent overview of key developments in the last thirty-five years of free will debates, but it is no mere history or summary. From his review of the literature, Timpe gleans important insights and concepts, using them to articulate and defend an important position on free will: what he calls "wide source incompatibilism." According to source incompatibilism, we can be morally responsible only if we are the ultimate sources of (some of) our actions, and we cannot be ultimate sources of our actions if causal determinism is true. The "wide" version of this view adds that we are the ultimate sources of an action only if we enjoy morally relevant alternative possibilities with respect to that action.

Chapter one provides a clear introduction to the main concepts at play in discussions of free will, such as "moral responsibility," "determinism," "compatibilism," "incompatibilism," and so forth. Timpe claims that incompatibilists and compatibilists alike think in terms of "two dominant general conceptions of the nature of free will" (10). On the first, being free consists in meeting an alternative possibilities condition: one must be "able to do otherwise than one in fact does" (10). On the second conception, free will consists in meeting a sourcehood condition: a free agent must be the "ultimate source of her actions" (10). (Contrary to what Timpe here suggests, I do not think many compatibilists embrace the notion of ultimate sourcehood. However, as the book progresses, Timpe drops the ultimacy language, suggesting that the sourcehood condition requires only that the agent be "the source of her choices in a particular way" (74).)

Chapter two begins with an exposition of the "basic argument" for incompatibilism:

(1) Free will requires the ability to do otherwise.

(2) If determinism is true, then no agent has the ability to do otherwise.

(3) Therefore, free will requires the falsity of causal determinism. (21)

Timpe then considers two different versions of compatibilism and their responses to this argument. "Strong Compatibilists," who think of freedom primarily as possession of alternative possibilities, reject premise (2). They claim that even if determinism is true, we can do otherwise in the relevant sense. "Weak Compatibilists," who think of freedom primarily as sourcehood, deny (1) (also known as "the principle of alternative possibilities" (PAP)). PAP is shown false, these philosophers maintain, by Frankfurt-style counterexamples (FSCs) -- stories in which an agent does action A on her own -- and so seems responsible for it -- despite being unable to do otherwise (because a "counterfactual intervener" would have forced her to do A if she had not done so on her own). Timpe then notes two incompatibilist responses to FSCs, both of which attempt to defend PAP: the "dilemma defense" and the "flicker of freedom" strategy.

Chapter three focuses on the dilemma defense. In Frankfurt's original story and in many similar FSCs, it seems the counterfactual intervener can properly block his victim's alternative possibilities only if he foreknows what the victim will choose to do, usually by observing in the victim a "prior sign" of the desired action. But now a dilemma arises: the connection between the prior sign and the desired action is either deterministic or not. If not, then the victim still has some alternative possibilities, and the FSC fails as a counterexample to PAP. If the connection is deterministic, then the FSC illicitly presupposes the compatibility of free will and determinism, thereby begging the question against incompatibilists. Timpe considers two different compatibilist responses to this dilemma. The first is to develop FSCs that do not in any way presuppose determinism. Timpe considers various "blockage cases" which purport to fulfill this goal, and argues that they fail. He then introduces his own case based on trumping preemption, which he believes is a genuinely indeterministic FSC. Timpe then considers the second compatibilist line of response to the dilemma defense, which is to argue that deterministic FSCs do not actually beg the question against incompatibilists. Timpe finds this response plausible. Thus he does not consider the dilemma defense a promising incompatibilist strategy.

Chapter four concerns the flicker of freedom response to FSCs. According to Timpe, flicker strategists seek to defend the following version of PAP:

APf : an agent is free with respect to an action A at time t only if there are morally relevant alternative possibilities related to A at time t. (55)

Flicker strategists point out that in every FSC, at least the following alternative possibilities remain: either the agent does A on her own (call this alternative O), or as a result of the intervener (alternative I). But as John Martin Fischer points out, these "flickers of freedom" may not be "robust" enough to be morally relevant. Timpe distinguishes between two different versions of the flicker strategy which diverge in their responses to Fischer's worry. The "weak" flicker strategy is to argue that any remaining alternative possibilities are morally relevant because they indicate that determinism -- which would undermine moral responsibility -- is false. Hence, the alternatives O and I are morally relevant, and so FSCs present no counterexample to APf . As Timpe notes, this strategy presupposes that determinism and freedom are incompatible, and so will seem convincing only to those who are already incompatibilists. The "strong strategy," on the other hand, seeks to argue that O and I are morally relevant for some additional reason, beyond the mere fact that they indicate the falsehood of determinism. Timpe considers Dan Speak's recent implementation of the strong flicker strategy and argues that it is not satisfactory. However, in his final chapter, Timpe himself seeks to develop a successful version of the strong strategy by drawing on the idea that sourcehood is morally relevant.

Chapter five begins by pointing out that merely having alternative possibilities is not enough to ground moral responsibility. One must also "have control over which alternative possibility becomes actual" (73). And it seems that one must be the source or origin of the action in the right way to enjoy this sort of control. So at this point, Timpe shifts his attention to views of freedom that focus on sourcehood. He begins by considering two influential compatibilist accounts of sourcehood: Frankfurt's view involving wholehearted identification with one's higher-order desires, and Fischer and Ravizza's notion of "guidance control." Timpe argues that both of these views are subject to manipulation counterexamples: stories in which a manipulator uses electronic brain stimulation, hypnosis, or other responsibility-undermining means to make his victim perform action A, but in a manner that satisfies the conditions laid down by the compatibilist accounts of sourcehood. Intuitively, the victim does not seem morally responsible for A, despite meeting the compatibilist conditions. So those compatibilist conditions must not fully capture our intuitive notion of the sourcehood necessary for moral responsibility.

As chapter six opens, Timpe notes that his preceding arguments show only the failure of two particular compatibilist accounts of sourcehood, and so leave open the possibility that some other satisfactory compatibilist account could be developed. Timpe seeks to close off this possibility by presenting and endorsing Derk Pereboom's influential "Four-Case Argument" for incompatibilism. According to this argument, we do not hold manipulated agents responsible because we see that their actions do not originate with them, but rather with their manipulators. But if determinism were true, no agent's action would originate with her: it can always be traced back to prior events beyond her control. A proper account of sourcehood, Timpe concludes, must be incompatible with determinism, and so we should embrace source incompatibilism.

In the remainder of chapter six, Timpe considers two important criticisms of source incompatibilism. The first is Fischer's "Held-Hostage" objection. If incompatibilism is true, the objection goes, then we cannot know that we are free unless we can know that determinism is false. But we don't know that determinism is false, and so "the incompatibilists cannot know whether or not we are free" (93); on incompatibilism, our view of ourselves as morally responsible agents is "held hostage" to general empirical findings (concerning whether determinism is true). Timpe next considers the "Luck Objection": if they are not causally determined by our character and/or other prior factors, then our choices are random, lucky events, over which we cannot exert responsibility-grounding control. Timpe endorses Robert Kane's response to the Luck objection: insofar as our choices are made for our own reasons, they are intelligible and not random, even if they are not causally determined. In a fascinating discussion, Timpe notes that the held-hostage objection exists in dialectical tension with the Luck Objection:

Here the compatibilist faces a trade-off. On the one hand, the wider she sees the scope of freedom undermining indeterminism to be, the more her view of free will is held hostage to the possible future discoveries of science. On the other hand, the more she thinks that free will is compatible with both determinism and indeterminism, the less motivated will be the Luck Objection to incompatibilism. (95)

In chapter seven, Timpe begins by distinguishing two kinds of source incompatibilism. Both hold that agents are free only if they are the ultimate sources of their actions. However, the views differ over whether alternatives are also necessary for freedom. "Narrow" source incompatibilists such as Eleonore Stump, Linda Zagzebski, and David Hunt insist that "there is no required alternative possibilities condition for … moral responsibility at all" (105). "Wide" source incompatibilists such as Robert Kane and Derk Pereboom claim that although sourcehood is the truly fundamental requirement for freedom, the appropriate notion of sourcehood entails "some minimally weak alternative possibilities condition" (117). Timpe thinks that when scrutinized, narrow source incompatibilism collapses into wide source incompatibilism. He illustrates this claim by examining Eleonore Stump's version of narrow source incompatibilism. Stump insists that FSCs can undermine the following version of PAP:

APa: an agent is free with respect to an action A at time t, only if she could have done an action numerically distinct from A at time t. (110)

However, she grants that in FSCs the mode of the action -- whether or not she does it on her own -- remains up to the agent. Timpe points out that from a source incompatibilist perspective, alternatives with respect to the mode of the action are morally relevant. For we are responsible for an action only if we are its ultimate source, and we can be the ultimate source only if we have alternatives with respect to the mode of the action. So in fact, Timpe argues, Stump believes that in any FSC, the victim has morally relevant alternatives; i.e., Stump is committed to APf, the same alternative possibilities condition that he and other wide source incompatibilists embrace.

Timpe concludes chapter seven by bringing together his discussion of FSCs from chapters two through four with his argument for wide source incompatibilism in chapters five through seven. He notes that wide source incompatibilists have a plausible way of working out the strong flicker strategy discussed in chapter four. They can mount a successful defense of APf by showing why the "flickers of freedom" are morally relevant "beyond merely insuring the falsity of determinism." For "If among the differences between the actual and alternate sequences of an FSC is the fact that the agent only fulfills the sourcehood condition in the actual sequence, then this will be a morally relevant difference" (118).

There are two ways in which I think this book could have been stronger. First, I think Timpe might have reflected a bit more on the way in which moral principles like Kant's "ought implies can" principle, or the idea that blame must be avoidable, dictate which alternatives count as morally relevant. In chapter seven, Timpe claims: "if APa were true, then this would entail the truth [of] APf …" (115). But there are counterexamples to this entailment claim. Suppose an evil demon determines me to murder my friend by cutting his jugular, but leaves it up to me whether I will cut the left or right jugular. In this case, it seems to me that I would satisfy APa, but not APf: I would be able to perform numerically distinct actions, but neither of these alternatives would be morally relevant, since either way I would be unable to avoid wrongdoing. This would be so (it seems to me) even if I were the indeterministic source of my specific action. So perhaps there is a distinct requirement for moral relevance over and above the incompatibilistic sourcehood requirement. This is at least an issue worth further exploration.

Second, I think Timpe's case for the incompatibilist account of sourcehood would have been stronger if he had considered more possible compatibilist rejoinders. The Four-Case Argument offers, in Timpe's words, "One way of understanding" why manipulation undermines sourcehood: namely, that "in such cases there would be a [deterministic] causal chain originating outside the agent" (90, my emphasis). But surely compatibilists could offer other ways of understanding why manipulation interferes with sourcehood. For example, they might say that I cannot be the proper source my action if the action is determined by some other person's more causally basic will. On this explanation, the lack of sourcehood in manipulation cases would not generalize to cases of non-intentional determinism; so this explanation would not yield a straightforwardly incompatibilist account of sourcehood. If Timpe had considered, and ruled out, compatibilist takes on manipulation such as the one just considered, his overall argument would have been even stronger.

Despite these criticisms, I highly recommend this book. It is tightly organized, and in a very helpful way: Timpe summarizes past debates in a way that brings out the truly key points of contrast or affinity between various important positions. I also found his argument against the viability of "narrow" source incompatibilism both convincing and important. Overall, this book is a valuable contribution to the current literature on free will; anyone interested in that topic would do well to read it.