Freedom, Action, and Motivation in Spinoza's Ethics

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Noa Naaman-Zauderer (ed.), Freedom, Action, and Motivation in Spinoza's Ethics, Routledge, 2020, 255pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780367362249.

Reviewed by Andrew Youpa, Southern Illinois University


This is a collection of original essays by ten scholars, with an in-depth introduction by the editor, Noa Naaman-Zauderer. Its title is apt: all ten essays deal with issues related to Spinoza's views on freedom, action, and motivation. The essays focus, as would be expected, on philosophical and interpretive issues that arise in Parts 3, 4, and 5 of the Ethics. It is not the volume's aim to provide an overview of Spinoza's views. As Naaman-Zauderer notes: "The main objective is thus neither to offer a comprehensive survey of Spinoza's view of freedom and activity in general . . . nor to refer to all aspects of his Ethics" (p. 3). Rather, each author addresses an issue or set of issues connected to the theme, and each contributes to an ongoing discussion in philosophy and scholarship. The contributors are established participants in contemporary debates, and the volume showcases the development and enrichment of their illuminating perspectives. The collection is an excellent addition to the growing body of Anglophone literature on the moral psychology and ethical theory of the Ethics. It is primarily for an audience of specialists and advanced students.

Michael Della Rocca, in his contribution, highlights the strengths of Spinoza's philosophy of action in comparison with two rival alternatives, Donald Davidson's and G. E. M. Anscombe's. Contemporary philosophy of action, according to Della Rocca, is at an impasse over how to differentiate actions from non-actions as well as how to differentiate a particular action from other actions. Della Rocca's view is that, by rejecting the presuppositions on which the impasse rests, Spinoza's philosophy of action provides a basis for progress.

Against a standard reading that Spinoza has a single notion of action that serves as a foundational component of his ethical project, Matthew J. Kisner contends that there are two distinct notions of action in the Ethics. There is action in the sense of being an adequate cause of an effect, which Kisner calls adequacy-activity, and action in the sense of striving to persevere in being, which he refers to as striving-activity. According to his view, adequacy-activity and striving-activity are distinct kinds of action, and Spinoza's notion of human freedom is tied to striving-activity such that someone can achieve human freedom without necessarily exhibiting adequacy-activity. A strength of this reading, according to Kisner, is that it accommodates the value that Spinoza ascribes to causal dependence, passivity, and cooperation for living well.

Lisa Shapiro sets out to show that the passions a philosopher identifies as primary reveal structural features of the philosopher's conception of cognition and experience. She deploys this view as a way of understanding the philosophical motivation behind the shift and paring down in Spinoza's taxonomy of the passions from the early Short Treatise to the Ethics.

Taking a systematic approach, John Carriero elucidates Spinoza's account of the metaphysical structure of a human being with the aim of shedding light on the nature of the primary affects and their role in Spinoza's ethical theory. On the basis of the reading he defends, Carriero draws three consequences for Spinoza's ethical theory: (1) that Spinoza does not subscribe to hedonism despite remarks that might appear otherwise, (2) that Spinoza rejects a traditional ordering of the passions in favor of embedding the passions in an underlying physical and psychological structure, and (3) that the highest good functions as an upper bound, and not as a telos. As an upper bound, the highest good is where a human ends up if all goes well, but it does not serve as a basis on which to claim that it is how a human is supposed to be.

Lilli Alanen explores Spinoza's theory of mind, what the nature of the body reveals about the human mind, and the way these views inform his account of cognition and the role of the primary affects in the salvation project at the heart of Spinoza's ethical theory. A question that motivates her discussion is: what is the nature of the self whose perfection is that on which the quality of our lives depends? According to Alanen, Spinoza subscribes to a type of dualism about the human mind, namely, there is the mind apart from the body, on the one hand, and the mind as the idea of the body, on the other. Moreover, similar to the view Kisner defends, Alanen concludes that Spinoza has two distinct notions of action, and each is tied to one of the two dimensions of the mind.

By reconstructing a minimalist account of agency from the Ethics, Donald Rutherford responds to the concern that Spinoza's metaphysics and moral psychology conflict with the view that humans are agents in an ethically meaningful sense and that his metaphysics and moral psychology are therefore incompatible with his normative ethical project and incompatible with normative ethical theory generally.

Julie R. Klein argues that freedom, in Spinoza's view, is an embodied, situated, and this-worldly affair, in contrast with Platonizing, other-worldly interpretations that treat the human mind's relation to the body as though it were a pilot to a ship and treat the self as though it were insulated from its environment. Whereas Rutherford's aim is to extract a notion of rational agency from the Ethics, Klein's aim is to foreground Spinoza's radical revision of agency, freedom, and salvation. She maintains that the human body and mind alike are natural forces embedded in and vulnerable to environmental conditions. Freedom is as much a matter of empowering the body while it exerts itself in a network of physical entities with their own natural forces and vulnerabilities as it is a matter of empowering the mind in its cognitive and affective network.

Contrary to a subjectivist reading that holds that good and bad are in the eye, opinion, desire, or pro-attitude of the beholder, Steven Nadler defends a realist reading of Spinoza's account of the moral qualities of good and bad. According to Nadler, goodness and badness are objective, mind-independent, and relational properties of things.

Next, Naaman-Zauderer investigates the epistemological structure of cognition as the basis for Spinoza's theory of freedom and the climactic development of his ethical theory in the second half of Part 5 of the Ethics. She makes a case for the view that the ethical theory includes two distinct kinds of human freedom, one that follows from the second kind of cognition and another that follows from the third kind of cognition. On this reading, rational freedom corresponds to and is based on reason, whereas intellectual freedom corresponds to and is based on intuitive knowledge.

Yitzhak Y. Melamed examines alternatives and offers a solution to a seeming inconsistency in Spinoza's views regarding divine love in Part 5. On the one hand, Spinoza states, "Strictly speaking, God loves no one, and hates no one. For God (by P17) is not affected with any affect of Joy or Sadness" (5p17c). On the other, he says, "From this it follows that insofar as God loves himself, he loves men, and consequently that God's love of men and the Mind's intellectual Love of God are one and the same" (5p36c). The solution that Melamed defends involves acquiescentia in se ipso, an affect introduced in Part 3, resurfacing in a scholium in Part 5 where it is identified with intellectual love.

Naaman-Zauderer, has done an admirable job assembling this terrific lineup of essays. In addition to her helpful introductory chapter, a few of the volume's virtues are the strength of the scholarship, the diversity of issues the essays address, the range and contrast of perspectives, and the way various strands of Spinoza's thought, such as the variety of types of passivity that appear in the Ethics, thread through the essays. While the contributors agree on many points, there is also a significant amount of disagreement among them. Needless to say, I encountered views that I agree with as well as a few that I disagree with. But these are the sort of disagreements that come with the territory. They are a manifestation of the level that scholarship on Spinoza's moral psychology and ethical theory has achieved in recent years. Looking forward, such disagreements promise to continue to fuel the vibrant interest that has led to this progress. My only complaint is that the volume does not include any up and coming scholars. It would have been nice to hear from a few who are emerging in the field, although their absence does not diminish the quality of the work in the volume, and the important contributions these essays make to our understanding of Spinoza's Ethics.