Freedom and Anthropology in Kant's Moral Philosophy

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Frierson, Patrick, Freedom and Anthropology in Kant's Moral Philosophy, Cambridge, 2003, 222pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521824001.

Reviewed by Dean Moyar, Johns Hopkins University


A great deal of work has appeared in the past five years on the role of anthropological considerations in Kant’s ethics. In the present book Patrick Frierson challenges this work by means of an objection initially leveled against Kant by Schleiermacher. The charge is that Kant’s use of anthropology, and of various “empirical helps and hindrances” to morality in general, contradicts the commitment to transcendental freedom on which Kant grounds his ethics. In addressing this charge Frierson does not linger on the details of Kant’s actual anthropological views, but rather stays tightly focused on the basic conceptual issue of how empirical factors can affect a free will that stands outside of all empirical causality. Frierson spends much of the book showing why exactly this problem is unavoidable for Kant, and just how the recent work utilizing Kant’s anthropology has not properly come to terms with the problem. Frierson does in the end think that there is an answer to the basic charge, and he provides a novel escape route by drawing on Kant’s modifications of his view in Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason. While Frierson’s diagnosis and the discussions of the literature are stronger than the proposed solution, overall the work is extremely clear, very well argued, and sensitive to the complexities of Kant’s writings.

There are many ways of denying the existence of a conflict between Kant’s basic principle of freedom and the host of postulates and recommendations involving the “empirical self” that he makes throughout his moral writings. For this reason, Frierson is justified in devoting a large portion of his project to clarifying the nature of the supposed contradiction. The crux of the issue is an “asymmetry” between the noumenal self and the empirical self. The fundamental claim of transcendental freedom, as the solution to the Third Antinomy, is that while we must think of the free self as the ground of appearances, those appearances cannot themselves affect the free self. The problem, then, of moral anthropology as an “empirical science” is that its conclusions cannot be morally relevant without compromising transcendental freedom. In so far as empirical factors, such as polite society or moral education, affect one’s will, they will contravene the basic asymmetry that has to hold given Kant’s commitment to freedom. There is no problem if these influences affect merely the “observed self,” or the self that appears, but if they affect the free, noumenal self, Kant’s position would, according to Frierson, become incoherent.

Talk of the noumenal self will already appear suspiciously misleading to some Kantians. It sounds like this problem, or contradiction, only arises as a metaphysical problem, and one can do an awful lot in Kantian ethics without buying into a strongly metaphysical reading of moral autonomy. Frierson is aware of this fact, and without explicitly committing himself one way or another, he is quick to point out that the issue he is interested in 1) arises within the practical point of view, and 2) holds whether one has a two-world or a two-perspective account of Kant’s metaphysics. First, the problem is not the standard problem of compatibilism, of how my actions can be uncaused in a noumenal sense and yet causally determined in the natural order. Rather, the issue is how anthropology can generate duties; the duty to promote polite society, say, depends on polite society having a moral influence, that is, affecting an agent’s moral status. But Kant also holds that “people must be considered from a practical perspective and thus as free from any empirical influence” (pp. 3-4). So the objection is not that metaphysically speaking the conclusions of anthropology contradict the will’s freedom as a noumenal cause, but rather that a practical difficulty seems to arise in simultaneously treating agents (including myself) as both free from empirical causes and as subject to such causes. Second, Frierson defends the “priority of freedom,” and hence the asymmetry thesis, on both a two-object and a two-perspective account of Kant’s idealism. The discussion of the priority of the practical on the two-perspective account is especially illuminating, as Frierson shows that a need for the practical is generated from within the theoretical perspective itself. One issue that arises in this discussion is that Frierson seems to equate the theoretical perspective and the empirical perspective, so that my own view of my actions, qua appearances, will be an observer’s perspective. He is quite right to emphasize that for Kant my will’s goodness is inscrutable in a very strong sense, so that there is no epistemic access to the noumenal realm, but I worry that he renders actions too much like events in distinguishing so sharply between my two perspectives on my action. Even though Frierson will later introduce the notion of expression to bridge the noumenal/empirical divide, the tendency to equate the theoretical and empirical still colors the view.

Having established the sense in which transcendental freedom precludes any influence of the empirical on the free will, Frierson next turns to the issue of how exactly Kant’s anthropology is an empirical, and morally relevant, science. The very notion of an empirical science that can ground universal claims seems suspect given Kant’s attention throughout his critical writings to synthetic a priori claims. Frierson recognizes that the problem he is generating would not be so grave, and might not require his solution, if anthropology had an a priori basis. Frierson therefore argues against Henry Allison’s view that Kant’s argument for radical evil (on Frierson’s view, a prototypical anthropological claim) must be . priori, and claims that radical evil is empirically grounded. Although his argument against Allison is convincing, the disagreement highlights a significant problem with Frierson’s thesis. Kant’s doctrine of radical evil might result from the sheer difference between the moral law, which applies to all rational beings, and the actions of beings like us who are sensibly conditioned (this account of the “origin of evil” is close to Allison’s view). Yet Kant does indeed say in the Religion, as Frierson points out, that we can confirm radical evil from examples in experience. The trouble is that from the beginning of his mature moral philosophy, the intersection of the noumenal and empirical is the central issue. Consider that Frierson lists among these helps and hindrances the practical postulates, the feelings of sympathy and respect, social institutions, the beautiful, and moral education (p. 31). It is very difficult to think that Kant could have developed so many empirically-oriented claims if they in fact stood in such clear contradiction with his basic commitment to transcendental freedom. Frierson thinks Kant’s solution only arrives in the Religion, but Frierson does not offer an account of how Kant could have held his claims to be coherent for many years before the innovations of that work.

A related aspect of Frierson’s account that worries me comes out in his discussion, in Chapter Three, of the cases of politeness, passions and affects, and character. From the way he invokes the problem with these empirical influences, one gets the impression that admitting their efficacy would commit Kant to letting empirically conditioned agents off the hook, giving them the excuse of unfreedom for their actions. But the point of the Fact of Reason (which Frierson discusses briefly, and seems to equate with transcendental freedom) is that no matter what the empirical influences on my will, I must still consider myself practically free and hence morally responsible. Frierson is well aware of this feature of Kantian freedom, and does locate a real problem in how an empirical science can generate positive duties, but much of the force of his central problem seems to rely on the threat of reversing (or at least eliminating) the “asymmetry” between the two realms. There is, however, a sense in which Kant can say whatever he wants about empirical influences on the will, and I can do all that I can to condition my will to do the right thing, for in the end freedom is unavoidable and undeniable. In an important sense there is no tension at all between the fact of empirical influence and the freedom we are conscious of through the Fact of Reason. I think the issue where Kant runs into difficulties is that of moral motivation, doing the good for the right reason. But the sorts of worries that the required “purity” of motivation raises (I might act, say, not for the sake of duty, but to avoid social stigma in polite society) are ones that Frierson does not address. That is, I see the conflict to be more with Kant’s rigorism thesis, such as it is, than with his thesis of transcendental freedom.

Based on what he takes to be the soundness of Schleiermacher’s charge, Frierson has two main complaints with the recent literature bringing together Kant’s “pure” ethics of freedom and his “impure” ethics of empirical influences. Frierson thinks that these authors either 1) “fail to give moral anthropology the significance it deserves,” or 2) “they sacrifice Kant’s commitment to freedom” (p. 69). The authors Frierson discusses as going astray in the first manner are Barbara Herman, Nancy Sherman, and G. Felicitas Munzel, while Frierson focuses on Robert Louden (and implicitly Allen Wood) as making the second mistake. The criticism of both Herman and Sherman is for using “Empirical Influences as Epistemic Aids,” as in Herman’s account of “rules of moral salience.” Sherman alone is criticized for taking empirical influences as instruments of morality and as constitutive of the good will. In none of these cases does Frierson deny empirical influences these roles; what he denies is that these authors capture the special sense in which “robust” empirical moral anthropology operates. In all three cases the shortcoming is that the author does not explain how empirical influences actually make agents morally better. The obvious way to address the real bite of moral anthropology is to show a direct link between empirical influences and the good will. Frierson attributes just such a claim to Louden, who takes empirical influences as “necessary propaedeutics” to morality. Frierson argues that the free will is – due to the asymmetry thesis – above any such causal influence from the empirical world. Louden captures the distinctive moral improvement afforded by anthropology only by sacrificing transcendental freedom.

Frierson gets his solution off the ground by drawing attention to Kant’s distinction between the “empirical will” and the “free will.” The question is how these two are related, or why we should be morally concerned with the “appearances” of the free will. To help explain this relation, Frierson introduces the notion of “expression,” and argues that how one expresses one’s free will is morally relevant in the strongest possible sense (p. 99). The great obstacle to utilizing this connection is Kant’s thesis of the inscrutability of the will, such that one’s actual reasons for action always remain in doubt. Frierson actually embraces this conclusion as a welcome barrier to moral complacency and because it helps maintain the distinction between the two wills (or two perspectives on the will). But the crucial condition that moral anthropology addresses, without violating freedom, is radical evil; the fact of evil introduces an obligation to improve oneself in the world of appearance, and entails the certainty that we can never be content with our moral progress. Yet, Frierson insists, we still need to ground the possibility that we have a good will. The second step in Frierson’s account is therefore Kant’s doctrine of grace, which Frierson endorses (while admitting that for Kant grace can only have the status of a belief). He claims “that grace, by reconciling moral hope, radical evil, and rigorism, makes room for a conception of the human good will that is good but not identical to a will that would express itself in a life of perfect conformity to the moral law” (p. 121). This human good will is the will that reacts against its own evil and is “in revolution.” Frierson very helpfully explicates Kant’s idea of moral revolution as a nontemporal situation, dispelling the idea that this revolution is a punctual event. We cannot know directly the status of this revolution, but we can hope for it. The basis of this hope is the expression of moral revolution, namely moral action observed in the realm of appearances.

Frierson takes his decisive step, then, in claiming that we are bound to do what we can to “combat the propensity to evil and promote good deeds in the future… . moral anthropology provides a means for extending the effects of deliberation beyond the present” (pp. 132-33). The introduction of a concern for the future is the bridge to move from the empirical science of moral anthropology to the practical realm of duty. Frierson sums up his conclusion in the following passage:

In the cool hours in which one acts from good maxims, one must seek to increase the number and effectiveness of future cool hours, to combat the deceptions and manipulations of one’s own evil will, and to promote any empirical influences likely to result in further improvement of one’s actions and observable intentions. None of this will grant knowledge that one has a good will; nothing can. But the greater the degree of resistance to evil, both present and future, the more justified one’s hope that one is good. This resistance to evil, present and future, is in any event what the moral law requires of human beings, wicked as we are. And the resistance to future evil involves attention to empirical helps and hindrances. (p. 133)

Moral anthropology is thus a kind of self-cultivation in the service of justified hope. Knowledge of the good will is impossible, but the struggle against evil is at least a reliable indicator that one has received God’s grace. In his final chapter Frierson translates his solution to the situation in which one utilizes moral anthropology to influence other agents, showing how a limited influence on others is fully consistent with Kant’s claims.

The impetus to employing Kant’s anthropological considerations has been to make his moral theory more attractive to those sympathetic to Aristotelian ethics by illustrating Kant’s appreciation for the “richness of human life” (p. 68). While Frierson’s presentation of and solution to the problem of moral anthropology are ingenious, and while he does offer one viable reading of Kant’s late moral philosophy, overall the account serves to make Kant’s theory less plausible than it is without anthropology. If employing moral anthropology requires Frierson’s solution, one might be better off leaving anthropology alone. Accepting the solution means that I act morally so as to observe the success of my struggle against evil and foster the hope that I might be good; I consult Kant’s anthropology to devise tactics for the ongoing revolution, a process without end. There is an intuitively plausible aspect to this account, as we all know that we are capable of moral improvement. But Frierson’s emphasis on Kant’s radical skepticism about one knowing the quality of one’s will, in conjunction with the goal of hope in a process unavailable to the agent, means that only someone receptive to this distinctively Christian outlook will be inclined to take seriously the overall picture. By pushing Kant’s hard distinctions, and by following the word of Kant’s Religion, Frierson ends up reproducing and confirming Hegel’s diagnosis of “the moral worldview” as a constant alternating between the here and the beyond, with little satisfaction and only an unstable affirmation of one’s deeds through the recognition of others.

Patrick Frierson has written a very good book. Not everyone will agree with the formulation of the main problem, and not everyone will be happy with the proposed solution. But Frierson’s argumentative clarity and resoluteness of purpose make this book an invaluable resource for coming to terms with Kant’s always challenging moral philosophy.