Freedom and Determinism

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Joseph Keim Campbell, Michael O'Rourke, and David Shier (eds.), Freedom and Determinism, MIT Press, 2004, 352pp, $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0262532573.

Reviewed by Eddy Nahmias, Georgia State University


The free will debate has taken off in recent decades, driven largely by Peter van Inwagen's revitalization of incompatibilism, Harry Frankfurt's ammunition for compatibilism, interesting libertarian theories, and well-developed compatibilist theories. In the last few years this work has been collected into numerous volumes.[1] The latest is Freedom and Determinism, edited by Joseph Keim Campbell, Michael O'Rourke, and David Shier, and drawn from papers presented at the 2001 meeting of the Inland Northwest Philosophy Conference.[2]

This volume offers five essays in which well-known philosophers in the field offer reviews of their positions, along with nine essays that offer interesting new arguments (see below). There is not too much overlap in content with the other recent collections on free will, and many of the important positions and arguments in the current debates are covered, with the notable exceptions of agent-causation theories and recent skeptical positions about the existence of free will and moral responsibility.[3] Unfortunately, however, the book is not ideal for either of its two potential markets. Many of its selections are too narrow and technical for non-specialists (including most students) who want an introduction to the contemporary debates. And for more advanced audiences, most of its review pieces cover familiar ground, limiting the book's primary appeal to the new work, some of which is tangential to the more central debates. Having said this, there is still much to offer both of these audiences, and several essays are indispensable for philosophers engaged in the free will debate, including a few that discuss tangential issues that should be more central to the traditional debates.

The volume's essays can be categorized in two ways: review essays vs. essays presenting new arguments, and (more reviewer-relative) "must-read" essays vs. "optional" essays. After I summarize and occasionally critique the essays below, I label them according to these categories:

R = primarily review of author's previous work

N = primarily new discussion

ME = must-read for expert in free will debate

MS = must-read for student (or other non-specialist)

OE = optional-read for expert

OS = optional-read for student

I hope this exercise will help this review serve what I take to be one of its intended purposes -- to inform potential readers whether they will want to get the book, and if so, which parts of it to spend their valuable time reading.[4]

Introduction, "Freedom and Determinism: A Framework," by Campbell, O'Rourke, and Shier:

This chapter does an excellent job of describing the central debates and positions in the literature and then providing useful summaries of the fourteen chapters that follow. The authors define various conceptions of freedom, offer five central questions in the debate, and introduce van Inwagen's Consequence argument (and its unavoidability operator Beta) and Frankfurt cases. My only qualm is with their stipulation that the concept "free will" refer to having alternatives for action (3). [ME, MS]

1) "Determinism: What We Have Learned and What We Still Don't Know" by John Earman:

Earman offers a very technical review of his work on the status of determinism in modern physics. For those who are not proficient in the philosophy of physics, this chapter is not accessible. This is unfortunate since Earman makes several significant points philosophers often overlook regarding the thesis of determinism. He explains why "there is no simple and clean answer" to the question "If we believe modern physics, is the world deterministic or not?" (43). It has yet to be "determined" whether the best interpretation of quantum mechanics will be consistent with determinism.[5] I take this conclusion to bolster the claim that whether humans are (and have ever been) free and responsible should not be "held hostage" to future discoveries by physicists (see Fischer on p. 197). But now I've gone and exposed my compatibilist tendencies! While I'm at it, Earman also explains why determinism does not entail predictability, undermining what I take to be one of the intuitive sources for the thought that determinism precludes free will (i.e., that it would make us predictable and manipulable). [R, OE, OS]

2) "Freedom and the Power of Preference" by Keith Lehrer:

Lehrer's essay reviews his impressive compatibilist theory developed in Metamind (1990), based on the idea that free action is action performed in accord with one's preferences (including one's "ultrapreference" to reason about one's preferences in ways one prefers). Preferences, unlike desires, are not passive and are subject to evaluation. Here, Lehrer adds the condition that free agents must have the preference structure they have because they prefer to have it. This condition aims to avoid manipulation counterexamples in which agents have their preference structure only because another agent creates it in them. In typical compatibilist fashion, Lehrer accepts that one's preference structure can be free though fully caused but not if it is caused in certain ways (e.g., by manipulation), and he also offers a conditional analysis of being able to prefer otherwise. Finally, he offers responses to the Consequence argument, pointing out (accurately) that the argument depends heavily on one's understanding of ability and of laws of nature: "If one builds incompatibility with freedom into the definition of laws by defining the latter in such terms, then incompatibility will be the result" (68). Incompatibilists will be skeptical of these responses, as well as Lehrer's attempt to invoke "mutual causal support and dependency" (57) to address concerns about infinite regresses of preferences. Nonetheless, they will have to work to develop these objections, as Lehrer's essay offers the most plausible, comprehensive defense of a compatibilist theory in this volume. [R, ME, MS]

3) "Agency, Responsibility, and Indeterminism: Reflections on Libertarian Theories of Free Will" by Robert Kane:

Kane, meanwhile, offers the volume's only comprehensive defense of a libertarian theory of free will. His view will be familiar to anyone who has read his outstanding book, The Significance of Free Will (1996), or his more recent defenses of it. While there is nothing new in this essay, for those unfamiliar with his work, it helpfully presents Kane's views on why, rather than just alternative possibilities (AP), "UR [ultimate responsibility] should be moved to center stage in free will debates" (74), and why indeterminism in decision-making need not undermine control. As usual, Kane succeeds in showing why event-causal libertarianism is no worse than compatibilist theories but fails in showing why it is any better (at least in grounding moral responsibility). And as usual, he does so in clear and eminently readable prose. [R, OE, MS]

4) "Trying to Act" by Carl Ginet:

Ginet's essay is less lucid. It is filled with variables and complex examples used to develop a detailed analysis of four disjunctive sufficient conditions for an agent's trying to act. For specialists interested in this question, the essay will be illuminating. But Ginet does not explain how his analysis connects with questions of freedom or moral responsibility (including his own incompatibilist arguments), so it seems out of place in this volume. And it will be inaccessible to most non-specialists. [N, OE, OS]

5) "The Sense of Freedom" by Dana Nelkin:

Nelkin addresses a topic too often neglected in free will debates, the nature of rational deliberation and its connection to the belief in freedom. She argues that rational deliberators necessarily have a sense that they are free and argues that this sense of freedom does not entail a belief in indeterminism but rather a belief that one's actions are up to oneself such that one is accountable for them, where this belief derives from seeing oneself as responsive to reasons. Deliberation requires a belief that one can typically succeed in reaching a decision and implementing it, so in this sense one must believe one has the ability to act on one's deliberations, though this does not commit one to a belief that each of one's alternatives for action are undetermined by prior conditions. Nelkin's conclusion challenges libertarians who claim that our experience of deliberation manifests a belief in indeterminism, and it offers the first step in an antiskeptical argument that uses our sense of freedom to show that we actually are free. [N, ME, OS]

6) "Libertarian Openness, Blameworthiness, and Time" by Ishtiyaque Haji:

Like Nelkin, Haji addresses a neglected but important issue, whether responsibility must be backwards-looking. He challenges the traditional thesis ("blame past") that an agent can only be blamed for an action after he has performed it, a thesis that is supported by the intuitive idea that an agent cannot be blamed for an action (or its consequences) unless he can do otherwise, and if he can do otherwise, one cannot know what he will do until he has in fact done it. Haji shrewdly applies Frankfurt cases to this idea to develop a case where one can know that an agent will kill before he does, suggesting that it is appropriate to blame the agent before he has done anything wrong. Though the complexity of Haji's cases may be confusing me, it seems that they only show that one can blame someone for making a decision before he actually carries it out and only if there are conditions that ensure the decision will be acted on. But libertarians could concede this point and maintain that an agent cannot be blamed for a (free) decision until it has been made. And for reasons familiar to Frankfurt-case devotees, the debate will then turn to whether Frankfurt cases can cut off all undetermined robust alternatives so as to suggest that an agent can be blameworthy without having an alternative decision available. Haji's note 7 (p. 148) suggests that his cases will be less effective against libertarians (e.g., Kane and van Inwagen) who emphasize the importance of an agent's indecisiveness for free actions (an emphasis that I take to weaken the plausibility of libertarianism). I think that the final section of Haji's essay is more interesting than the technical discussion that precedes it. There he points out that different conceptions of moral responsibility influence one's view of the temporal questions and suggests that his own "self-disclosure" view does not entail "blame past" since an agent can disclose what she morally stands for before she acts on it. [N, ME, OS]

7) "Moderate Reasons-responsiveness, Moral Responsibility, and Manipulation" by Todd Long:

Long brings the issue of manipulation into the discussion, an issue I believe is taking center stage in the free will debate since one of the strongest remaining arguments for incompatibilism is that there is no principled way to distinguish between an agent who satisfies compatibilist conditions because she was causally determined to do so and an agent who satisfies the same conditions because she was manipulated by another agent to do so. Long uses this point in the context of a Frankfurt case to put pressure on Fischer and Ravizza's reasons-responsive (RR) compatibilist theory. Long suggests that the same RR mechanism can issue in the same decision in both the non-manipulated (actual) branch of a Frankfurt case and in the manipulated (counterfactual) branch, because the manipulator can drive the desired decision by changing the inputs (e.g., reasons) to the RR mechanism rather than by bypassing the RR mechanism and using a process that is not RR. Long thinks this forces Fischer and Ravizza either to supplement their theory by explaining the difference between the two branches or to accept that an agent who acts on an RR mechanism can be responsible even if severely manipulated. Like Haji, Long uses Frankfurt cases in a creative and illuminating way. I think he is right to conclude that his case need not undermine this compatibilist account but that it does force compatibilists to deal with manipulation cases. And I think they can do so. They can begin by pointing out that manipulation by a goal-directed agent cuts off alternatives that "blind" causal processes do not. A manipulator can adjust his manipulation however required to achieve his goals; natural causal processes do not have goals. So, for a determined agent, had things gone differently (and determinism does not preclude this since the past and laws are not necessary), the agent could act differently; whereas, for a manipulated agent, had things gone differently, the manipulator would find a way to make sure the agent did not act differently. At a minimum, this difference, I suspect, drives our intuitions that many types of manipulation are clearly freedom-compromising whereas our intuitions about determinism's relationship to free will are not so clear.[6] Another difference is that responsibility can be shared among agents so that a manipulator may (intuitively if not justifiably) "drain away" some, though perhaps not all, of the responsibility from the manipulated agent, though the latter may still be partially responsible (e.g., she may have developed beliefs and desires that take only minimal tinkering to issue -- through an RR mechanism -- in a blameworthy choice). Long's lucid essay effectively brings attention to these important issues. [N, ME, MS]

8) "Which Autonomy?" by Nomy Arpaly:

Arpaly's main point is that the concept of autonomy is used in too many ways to be functional as a label for the condition(s) required for agents to be morally responsible. I agree (I'd like us to use "free will" to label those conditions -- contra the editors' use of it). However, I think the concept of agent autonomy is the one on Arpaly's list most compatibilists are analyzing, though some think agent autonomy requires authenticity, and Arpaly, as she does in her other work, offers interesting literary counterexamples to the necessity of authenticity for responsibility. Though it would be a rhetorical mistake for compatibilists to use "autonomy" while giving "free will" to the incompatibilists, it would not be as confusing as Arpaly suggests so long as authors are clear about what they mean by "autonomy" and its precise relations to moral responsibility (as, for example, Al Mele is). Arpaly also worries that such accounts of autonomy are often too stringent to serve as viable conditions for attributing responsibility (e.g., 176), but this worry neglects the possibility that these accounts are -- or should be -- put in terms of capacities agents possess and exercise to varying degrees that map (perhaps imperfectly) onto the degree to which agents should be held accountable for their actions. Finally, Arpaly, like Long, draws attention to the problem of differentiating between manipulation and other causal histories, including ones like conversion that involve rapid and extreme changes in one's character and preference structure (183-4). This problem is significant, but again, I think it is not insurmountable. [N, OE, OS]

9) "The Transfer of Nonresponsibility" by John Martin Fischer:

Fischer's essay reviews his counterexamples to the "direct argument" for the incompatibility of determinism and moral responsibility, which employs a principle of transfer of nonresponsibility (e.g., if A is not responsible for p, and if p then q and A is not responsible for this fact, then A is not responsible for q). Fischer offers new responses to objections from Eleanor Stump and Michael McKenna that focus on the fact that his counterexamples require overdetermination or preemption, and he concludes that his argument can withstand these objections, at least enough to maintain what he accurately labels a "dialectical stalemate" (defined on 198-199). I think Fischer is right that, in the face of the numerous stalemates that litter the free will debate, the burden of proof is on the incompatibilist. Fischer puts this in terms of the attractions of compatibilism (e.g., it makes it more likely we are morally responsible). I would add that incompatibilist arguments have the burden because they rely on a conception of free will that makes more demanding metaphysical claims than compatibilist alternatives.[7] [R, OE, OS]

10) "Van Inwagen on Free Will" by Peter van Inwagen (of course!):

Van Inwagen, on the other hand, takes the dialectical complexity of the free will debate to suggest "mysterianism," the view that, while we obviously have free will, it seems incompatible with both determinism and indeterminism and hence impossible. So, it is a mystery how free will exists. Unlike Fischer, van Inwagen thinks it must (somehow) be that free will is compatible with indeterminism since he thinks his Consequence argument succeeds in showing free will is incompatible with determinism. Beginning with the genesis of this argument, van Inwagen offers a comprehensive summary of four decades of van Inwagen's thoughts on free will. He proceeds through his "restrictivism" (the view that acts of free will are rare because they occur only when we make close-call decisions), his response to Frankfurt's assault on the necessity of alternative possibilities, his rethinking of principle Beta, and finally his mysterianism, including his concluding point that agent causation cannot help make sense of free will. It's a shame that "van Inwagen has thought little about free will in the last ten years" (222). He seems to take the view regarding most objections to his positions that he takes regarding Frankfurt cases, that "as far as he is concerned, his original arguments for this position are the only answer to these counter-arguments that was really needed" (222). But it would be helpful to see how he would respond to other impressive responses to the Consequence argument, since it remains the most influential argument for incompatibilism (I take the view that most other incompatibilist and skeptical arguments, such as Galen Strawson's, rely on the same basic premises and principles as the Consequence argument). For instance, it would be nice to see how van Inwagen would respond to the objections that John Perry advances in the subsequent chapter. [R, OE, MS]

11) "Compatibilist Options" by John Perry:

Perry's essay is, along with Lehrer's and Long's, the highlight of this volume. Perry offers important distinctions among various accounts of laws of nature and of abilities to set up his responses to the Consequence argument. These responses will not be convincing to most incompatibilists but they do convince me of two points: first, that the free will debate revolves largely around one's understanding of laws of nature -- and specifically, whether the laws are reductionistic or include laws regarding human choices -- as well as one's understanding of cognitive abilities (or capacities); and second, that the debate about the Consequence argument, including how to understand laws and abilities, illustrates further examples of Fischer's "dialectical stalemates." Perry distinguishes between strong and weak accounts of laws of nature. In contrast to the strong (necessitarian) account of laws, the weak account takes laws to be descriptions of true generalizations. This Humean view suggests that, contrary to a crucial premise in the Consequence argument, a determined agent is able to act otherwise in that if she did act otherwise, a law that describes her choice would be different.[8] Perry does not find this view attractive but takes another tack by distinguishing different accounts of ability. In contrast to the strong account, the weak account of ability says that an agent is able to perform an action even if it is "settled" that she will not perform it.[9] Though Perry does not put it quite this way, I take him to be distinguishing between general capacities agents have to perform types of actions (including making choices) and particular occasions on which agents exercise (or fail to exercise) those capacities to act in certain ways, and to be arguing that we have the freedom-relevant ability to act in ways we do not act as long as we possess the relevant capacities to do so at the time, even if it is settled (e.g., determined) that we will not exercise our capacities in that way on this particular occasion (see 245). Since I've always been dubious of the suggestion that determinism entails that "does not" implies "cannot" (248), Perry's argument convinces me. And it demands that incompatibilists be more explicit about what abilities they have in mind when they conclude from Consequence-style arguments that determinism entails that agents lack the ability to do otherwise. [N, ME, MS]

12) "Freedom and Contextualism" by Richard Feldman:

Feldman raises objections to John Hawthorne's exploratory application of contextualism to the free will debate. Though he raises important critiques of Hawthorne's account, I think Feldman does not explore some of the possibilities for contextualism in this debate or important neighboring ideas, such as Manuel Vargas' "revisionism."[10] Contextualism about freedom claims that the truth-value of a statement about free action (and presumably moral responsibility) depends on the context of the utterance of the statement. In ordinary contexts it may be true that a determined action is free even if the same action may not count as free in a philosophical context. Feldman ignores the "may" in these claims and argues that this position concedes too much to the incompatibilist. But a compatibilist contextualist need not concede the truth of incompatibilism in philosophical contexts but instead use contextualist ideas as an error theory to explain what contextual factors lead some people (e.g., some philosophers) to accept incompatibilist arguments when the context is "demanding," while most people (including these philosophers) continue to act in the "real world" with the belief that we are free and responsible despite being ignorant about whether we are determined or not. Feldman is certainly right that contextualism does not answer the question of why, within philosophical contexts, intuitions diverge about free will (as with knowledge), leading to those pesky "dialectical stalemates." [N, OE, OS]

13) "Buddhism and the Freedom of the Will: Pali and Mahayanist Responses" by Nicholas Gier and Paul Kjellberg:

The volume ends with two essays that, in my opinion, could have been excluded. Non-Western approaches to Western philosophical problems can be illuminating, including Buddhist approaches to free will.[11] But Gier and Kjellberg's essay tries to do too much, dealing with several different Buddhist perspectives on causation and the self in addition to freedom and responsibility. I think I understood enough to say that it looks as though Buddhists are either compatibilists or skeptics about free will. And I appreciated the authors' discussion of why our version of the free will problem arose in the Modern era in light of Descartes' fracturing the inner and outer worlds and Newtonian physics' painting causation as mechanistic, linear interactions. [N, OE, OS]

14) "After Compatibilism and Incompatibilism" by Ted Honderich:

Honderich's "rapid paper" (311) reads like a talk and offers a sketchy version of his expansive and interesting views on the free will problem. He is right that there are conflicting conceptions and intuitions about free will but too quick to suggest that this entails that philosophers aren't debating some generally shared concept or that his "attitudinism" thereby offers a satisfying resolution. He is also right that any solution to debates about freedom and responsibility will turn on (perhaps radical) responses to the thorny problems of consciousness and causation. But in this essay Honderich does not tell us much about what such responses might look like. [R, OE, OS]

Freedom and Determinism thus offers several useful outlines of influential arguments in the free will debates and several interesting responses to these arguments and new discussions of neglected topics that bear on them. Some chapters seem out of place or too sketchy. But most have something valuable to offer the expert, the novice, or both.

[1] From (roughly) most to least expertise required of the reader: The Oxford Handbook of Free Will, edited by Robert Kane (Oxford, 2002), Moral Responsibility and Alternative Possibilities, edited by David Widerker and Michael McKenna (Ashgate, 2003), Free Will, 2nd edition, edited by Gary Watson (Oxford, 2003), Agency and Responsibility, edited by Ekstrom (Westview, 2001), and Free Will, edited by Robert Kane (Blackwell, 2002).

[2] The volume is not just a conference proceedings. The dozens of contributors to the conference were invited to submit their essays for review and revision, from which the volume's 14 chapters were selected.

[3] Such skepticism is the position that free will and moral responsibility do not exist (or are even impossible), as represented by philosophers such as Derk Pereboom and Galen Strawson (van Inwagen's chapter offers arguments that might lead one to skepticism). The volume also does not cover less active areas of the free will debate, such as logical fatalism or God's foreknowledge, nor does it address relevant work in the cognitive sciences.

[4] Another way to divide up the essays is according to whether they support an incompatibilist position (libertarian vs. skeptical) or a compatibilist position. In fact, only two essays support incompatibilism (both libertarian), Kane's and van Inwagen's (chapters 3 and 10). The others either support compatibilism (chapters 2, 5, 6, 9, and 11), do not deal with the compatibility question (chapters 1, 4, and 8) or are best read as neutral between the two positions (chapters 7, 12, 13, and 14).

[5] In fact, Earman argues for the surprising conclusion that classical Newtonian physics, but not quantum mechanics or special relativity, is inconsistent with determinism (23-28).

[6] For thoughts along these lines, see Gideon Yaffe's "Indoctrination, Coercion and Freedom of the Will," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 67 (2003): 335-356. For discussion of prephilosophical intuitions about the determinism and free will, see Nahmias, Morris, Nadelhoffer, and Turner's "Is Incompatibilism Intuitive?," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research (forthcoming).

[7] See Nahmias et al., "Is Incompatibilism Intuitive?" (forthcoming).

[8] Perry distinguishes his discussion from David Lewis' similar response by avoiding the need for Lewis' "local miracles." For a more detailed discussion of how a Humean conception of laws influences the compatibility question, see Helen Beebee and Al Mele's "Humean Compatibilism," Mind 111 (2002): 235-241.

[9] An agent's doing A at t is "settled" if there is some proposition (or set of propositions) P that is made true prior to t and P entails the proposition that the agent does A at t. Hence, determinism would entail that all human actions are settled in that a proposition P (describing the world at some time prior to any human actions and the laws of nature) entails any proposition describing a human action. Perry offers an important discussion of how to understand the idea of a proposition being "made true" (234-237).

[10] Revisionism is the view that philosophical accounts of free will and moral responsibility can (and often do) revise some but not all of our ordinary conceptions about these concepts and the relevant practices. Feldman does not address the original Lewis-style contextualist discussion of free will, Terry Horgan and George Graham's "In Defense of Southern Fundamentalism," Philosophical Studies 62 (1991): 107-134.

[11] See Charles Goodman's "Resentment and Reality: Buddhism on Moral Responsibility," American Philosophical Quarterly 39 (2002): 359-372.