Freedom and Limits

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John Lachs, Freedom and Limits, Patrick Shade (ed.), Fordham University Press, 2014, 499pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823256754.

Reviewed by Tom Rockmore, Peking University


John Lachs began to publish in 1959. Since that time he has brought out a large number of papers and books. These essays, collected and prefaced by Patrick Shade, span more than 50 years. They appear in a series on American philosophy, appropriately enough since Lachs is in some ways a quintessentially American thinker, though in other ways someone who proverbially marches to a different drummer. The papers are loosely organized into five parts (Mind and Reality, Self and Society, Pluralism and Choice-Inclusive Facts, Meaningful Living, Human Advance and Finite Obligation), ranging widely over a vast series of themes. The different essays are held together by Lachs' understanding of philosophy as well as the themes in which he is personally invested, and which he describes in an interesting "Prologue: The Personal Value and Social Usefulness of Philosophy."

The "Prologue" is significant in that Lachs, who is uninterested in strictly following any particular school or trend, immediately lays his philosophical cards on the table, so to speak. As a product of the golden age of the Yale department, which was pluralist, he embraces pluralism in denying there is a single royal road to philosophical insight. Thus he was for a time one of the very few card-carrying supporters of epiphenomenalism, a doctrine he cheerfully concedes is an obscure, acquired taste. Through his longstanding interest in Santayana and for other reasons, he is allied with pragmatism, which he understands in a widened sense going beyond the familiar triad of Peirce, James and Dewey. Yet even there his commitment is limited, since he cannot bring himself to believe, as he candidly points out, the view he links to Dewey that "social construction goes all the way down." He believes, on the contrary, that "there must be a residuum of things or facts on which the edifice of our thought is built" (22).

Lachs' main interest runs counter to the prevailing struggle between analytic and continental philosophy. In returning to an earlier approach, he is less concerned with philosophical rigor than with social utility, mainly interested in theories linked to concerns arising in daily life, hence with the improvement of the human condition.

Lachs' concern with different kinds of social practice directs his attention outside the university, where he interacts with non-academics on questions of personal significance and public policy. His concern that philosophy needs to become less academic led him in the late 1970s to take an active role in the revolt by pluralists and others, lest we forget, against professional exclusivity as well as the related dominance of analytic philosophy, both of which are still important factors in the profession. He thinks philosophy should aim at social improvement, at changing lives, instead of disinterested knowledge, whenever necessary eschewing technical details. He believes "There is a large public waiting anxiously for what philosophy can offer -- for careful thinking, clear vision, and the intelligent examination of our values" (31). Yet he also thinks that the kind of contribution philosophy can make to the commonweal depends on a pluralistic vision of the discipline.

Lachs clearly understands himself to be what is now sometimes called a public philosopher, someone who is concerned at this late date with recovering a meaningful role for philosophy in the modern world. His concern to bring philosophy into the public arena, on display in the essays in this volume, leads him in a variety of directions pointing toward the different interests of an inquiring mind. These essays reveal the development of his ideas as well as the breadth of his concerns running from Fichte to Santayana, happiness to selling organs, meaningful living to the relationship of philosophy to the surrounding context, and so on. These papers are composed in a clear, spare style, exhibit charity toward specific thinkers, whenever possible treat concrete human problems, and are marked by the invariable concern to arrive at practical solutions.

This volume contains 32 essays. Not all of them can be discussed in the space we have to work with. It will be sufficient to mention samples. Lachs began his career writing about Santayana, to whom he has devoted two books and 25 papers. The latter looms larger earlier than later as Lachs increasingly insists on the practical pay off of theories.

In "The Impotent Mind" he refutes the view that epiphenomenalism is "a thoughtless and incoherent theory" by examining three main criticisms, none of which, he claims, is conclusive. This argument is of limited scope, intended merely to keep open the epiphenomenalist option, which it does not seek to establish. Lachs comes to epiphenomenalism through Santayana, who, though often grouped among the American pragmatists, is less often read. In a further paper, "Santayana's Philosophy of Mind", Lachs seeks to call attention to the Santayana's little discussed position. He rejects his system in arguing against any system, while touting Santayana's contribution to the mind-body problem in pointing out that epiphenomenalism is incompatible with any form of causation.

Lachs insists on his identification with American philosophy in general. He takes a broad view of American philosophy, which he regards as synonymous with pragmatism, and a widened view of the latter in which, in his account, Santayana and Peirce, who are usually regarded as far apart, are deeply similar. Lachs, who detects no less than seven points of similarity, acknowledges they ultimately differ. He situates their deep dissimilarity in what Santayana calls "the large facts," which Lachs translates as "moral truths."

What, then, is American philosophy? Lachs characterizes this domain in "The Transcendence of Materialism and Idealism in American Thought." His aim is not to identify a single generic feature of all such views but rather to note what he sees as a characteristic American twist on a continental theme. Lachs thinks much of the Western tradition consists in a confrontation between materialism and idealism, and controversially identifies "idealism" as the view that "the ultimate constituents of existence are ideas or minds or expressions of will or fragments of consciousness or moments of sentience" (99). He goes on to suggest, pointing to Kant and Fichte, that American philosophy's discovery or rediscovery of activity metaphysics (which, we may add, goes back to Aristotle) is characterized by its elimination of many of the excrescences of its continental formulations. In pointing out that in Dewey and many other American thinkers the focus lies in examining "daily human practice" (110), Lachs claims that American philosophy offers our best chance for understanding "human nature and human society" (111).

One of Lachs' signature themes is social mediation, which he links to the central goal of happiness in a rationally-ordered social context. He approaches happiness in the first instance through Mill's utilitarianism. In "Two Views of Happiness in Mill" he identifies the "official" view of happiness as pleasure without pain and also as a reformulation of the quasi-Aristotelian view in reference to the lives or part of lives we lead (128). This felicitous way of reading Utilitarianism charitably uncovers a more interesting view.

Happiness requires a social context in which it occurs. Mediation appears in all social contexts, in social organization of all kinds. This suggests proper and less proper types of social mediation, such as an understanding of the nature and proper limits of the role of the community with respect to the individual.

In a series of essays and several books Lachs pursues this general theme while reviewing a series of current practical problems. The dominant theme here seems to be the idea that the individual is a central but not an infinite value. Lachs examines this view in a variety of ways. In "Questions of Life and Death" he contends that life itself is not a transcendent value in making two points. On the one hand, we are never justified in "taking money from those who have" (133) to pay the medical bills of those who have not. He couples this with the idea that, since financial resources are limited, we must reflect on how much we wish to spend to keep the elder members of the population alive.

Lachs pursues this line in a paper entitled "On Selling Organs." Here he opposes the very idea that governments can legitimately tell us what to do, not only, say, as concerns prostitution, but even in the more extreme case of selling parts of oneself. He makes it clear that he does not advocate that people sell organs, but rather that, if this is their wish for whatever reason, society must not keep them from doing so.

This view presupposes a conception of the human individual, which Lachs sketches in his account of "The Cost of Community." His aim here is to provide a view of the relation of individuals to the social context through mediation. Lachs intends this concept to replace the better known view of alienation. Individuals act for or mediate actions on one's behalf in the role of a so-called intermediate man (162). Among the consequences is that others become the instruments of our will. Mediation leads to a growing sense of passivity and impotence. Mediation also results in increasing psychic distance between people and their actions. Lachs goes on to make two points. Mediation is not equivalent to division of labor, which is a form of mediation. And, taken together, mediation and the psychic distance it engenders figures in Lachs' eyes as a candidate to replace alienation.

Lachs regards mediation not as a bad thing, but as to be encouraged. Like Mill, he thinks that for the most part we are better off in "Leaving Others Alone," in muting our concern to impose our will in favor of a neutral stance. This attitude has several benefits. One lies in treating others as moral agents capable of organizing their own good (207). Another is to "acknowledge the existence of multiple perfections" (210) that often enough disagree with one's own instinct. Still another lies in the value of "a generous pluralism" (212).

Lachs' interest in philosophical pluralism sounds what is today an unfamiliar theme. He comes by his philosophical pluralism naturally as a product of the Yale Department, which, when he was there, was strikingly pluralist, though that did not last. His pluralism was strengthened at Vanderbilt, where the Philosophy Department was stocked by Yale graduates concerned to imitate the New Haven model. More recently this approach has fallen out of favor with the profession's widespread insistence on one kind of animal as opposed to a veritable philosophical zoo.

Lachs takes up the theme in "Philosophical Pluralism." As he points out, the tendency toward philosophical specialization is coupled with disrespect to put it mildly for other approaches outside the contemporary mainstream. The presupposition is that there is a philosophical royal road, which many, including Lachs, deny. In passing, Lachs returns to and amplifies his view of the reasons and justification of the pluralist revolt against the analytic establishment. He takes to task the national organization of the APA, which did virtually nothing useful during this revolt either to rectify the situation or thereafter to improve the philosophical climate. In responding to what he perceives as professional narrowness, Lachs contends philosophy should be "as pluralistic as its practitioners want it" (295). Lachs, who should not be misunderstood, is not advocating that every department feature everything or even everything currently in fashion. He is rather advocating the avoidance of "a monolithic orientation" (297). He further believes that it is in the interests of philosophy for the APA to do what it can to engage the broader, non-specialist public.

Lachs' critical relation to American pragmatism is on display in a trio of essays on Dewey. In "Aristotle and Dewey on the Rat Race" he criticizes Dewey against the background of Aristotle's distinction between activity and movement. Lachs describes the distinction in question under the heading of activity and process. He prefers Dewey's revised formulation of the means-end distinction. He thinks in this way it is possible to overcome the basic Aristotelian incompatibility between means and ends, value and utility (336). Lachs understands Dewey as challenging this view through the idea of an action that is both a means and an end (338). The advantage of this approach lies in turning away from cognition and toward a widened range of activity as ends. Yet this is not well adapted to life, which is often only tolerable, as the concept of mediation parenthetically suggests, since the means and end are separated in practice (342). Lachs' solution for this dilemma lies in a qualified return to the Stoic approach of maximizing satisfaction through converting means into ends, or processes into activities, in short "by doing each element in them for its own sake, as an end" (345).

Lachs continues this reflection in "Improving Life" and in "Stoic Pragmatism." The former essay begins with a remark on Frankfurt's view, which Lachs finds superficially similar to Dewey's, then examines the latter in restating the analysis of the previous essay on Dewey and Aristotle. The focus now is, as the title suggests, on improvement or meliorism. Lachs finds Dewey's view helpful, just not helpful enough. He sees Dewey's view of "means-end integrated actions" as consisting in three points: each action is enjoyable in itself, actions are causally linked, and earlier and later phases are united (354). The difficulty lies in the third point, or the view that means and ends must be united in a causal sequence. Lachs takes this to indicate "either the means must be a part of the end, or the end must be a completion of the means" (355). The difficulty is that in a world in which individuals are separated through "chains of mediation" (358) it is difficult, perhaps not really possible, to consider the consequences of our actions as fulfilling our efforts. Lachs concludes Dewey is finally unable to explain how means-end relationships that are not integrated can be integrated (360) -- in different terms, unable to understand life as a work of art.

Lachs returns to a widened version of this theme in considering pragmatism in general in his remarks on "Stoic Pragmatism." He begins with the contrast between "pragmatic ambition" to improve things and "stoic equanimity." Many, perhaps most, observers think these two attitudes are incompatible, including Dewey, who restates the contrast as one between civilized and "savage" attitudes toward life (364). Lachs, who desires to bring these attitudes closer together, makes a case for what he terms stoic pragmatism. The argument consists in three points: at times the pragmatic attitude is inappropriate, the description of pragmatism and stoicism as separated by active and passive attitudes is not quite right, and attempts at amelioration must accept the means at hand. Lachs observes that formulaic descriptions of stoics as merely passive do not meet the test of the texts. He goes on to note what he sees as "an intimate connection" between the Stoic need for "acquiescence" and the pragmatist interest in "amelioration" (374). Lachs, who thinks that Stoicism and pragmatism enrich each other, calls for Stoic pragmatism. Stoic pragmatists are less hopeful than ordinary pragmatists, but less passive than ordinary stoics. Stoicism brings to pragmatism an awareness of the contingency of life.

Lachs' inquiry yields a somewhat different, perhaps more realistic, and hence more relevant approach to pragmatism. He applies this view in reconsidering philosophy as a discipline in an account of "The Relevance of Philosophy to Life" and more concretely in "Epilogue: Physician Assisted Suicide." Lachs distinguishes between a narrow and a broad conception of responsibility in medicine as well as in philosophy. In reviewing ways in which philosophy is socially relevant, he argues that a philosopher's life must exhibit a unity of theory and action. A philosopher, Lachs holds, is obligated to take a more than minimal view of responsibility as concerns "fullness of soul" (392), but also in view of the role of the university in preparing young people for life outside it, above all through teaching. He agrees with many that philosophy fulfills itself in influencing our action (393), since beliefs and actions are linked. This suggests that as philosophers we need to bring our lives into harmony with our beliefs.

Lachs brings these considerations to bear in his account in the Epilogue of physician-assisted suicide in remarks on the death of his mother at 103. The situation of an exceptionally old person unable to die, kept alive by the very real advances of modern medicine, raises in concrete fashion the question of physician-assisted suicide. This way of framing the situation surpasses the usual abstraction of bioethics in posing the question: "is it acceptable to provide her," or anyone, "with aid in dying?" (461). We must distinguish between what happened in this case, where the patient was finally helped by medical personnel to die, and what should morally occur. Lachs here addresses a number of concerns: she (a person of this age) has no future; claims for the sacred character of human life require justification that is not easily forthcoming; the possibility to enjoy life as a value at some point is no longer a practical possibility; and the state that must protect us has no moral right to protect us from ourselves since "we must learn to be our own masters" (466).

Lachs goes on to argue in favor of physician-assisted suicide. He notes that this view is resisted by many physicians, especially by those who take a narrow view of their calling as merely treating disease. Yet the problem is created through the success of modern medicine. From a generally utilitarian perspective, Lachs distinguishes between what is legal and what is good in acknowledging the moral dilemma of physician-assisted suicide. He thinks termination of life requires adequate reasons, including the time left as well as its quality. He may be applauded for citing the situation of his own parent in making his case for a practical solution to this increasingly frequent practical enigma.

I would like to close this account with two remarks about Lachs' relation to pragmatism and to the philosophical tradition. American pragmatism has since Dewey's death mainly assumed the form of scholarship about Peirce, James and Dewey. Lachs innovates in this respect in treating pragmatism not as a finished product, encased in impregnable theoretical armor so to speak, able to take on all comers, but rather as a live option, which must succeed in practice to succeed at all, in two ways. In Lachs' version pragmatism is not finished but unfinished. Its unfinished state is visible in that it is able to learn from other approaches, and hence malleable. He exhibits this view in his effort to make a case for a rapprochement between pragmatism and Stoicism. He seems to be saying that a theory that can still change, can take on new challenges, and is able to adapt as the world develops and changes,--a theory that has not been frozen into a mere object for scholarly contemplation--is still alive, so to speak. He further points out pragmatism is applicable to the world in which we live in myriad ways, hence it not only calls for philosophy to be useful, but declares that it is in fact useful.

Early in the Western tradition Socrates was one of the first public philosophers. This view of philosophy as a means to come to grips with and contribute to everyday life has since all too often been neglected. Lachs' approach to pragmatism is a prime instance of a view of philosophy that is rigorous as well as useful, but, if one must choose, useful above all, not sufficiently represented but perhaps finally more interesting than alternatives. Those who practice philosophy in which rigor is paramount notoriously have little time for those outside the narrow professional fold. In our age tension between different normative views of philosophy erupted in the pluralists concern to allow for differing approaches in seeking to liberate philosophy as it is now practiced from often narrow contemporary views of the profession. It is not clear there has to be a choice between the drive for rigor, which is dominant in contemporary philosophy, and the turn toward the public sphere. Yet if one must choose, and if the divide between the public and the private is a defensible distinction, then the public should get the nod over the private.